Reflections on Time and Politics

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Nathan Widder, Reflections on Time and Politics, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008, 208pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271033945.

Reviewed by Dorothea Olkowski, University of Colorado at Colorado Springs


Recently I browsed through looking over the books by and about Gilles Deleuze. I found over 240 books, quite a lot it seems. Books on Deleuze and art, Deleuze and other philosophers, Deleuze and cinema, Deleuze and literature, Deleuze and politics, Deleuze and time. This raises the question, which if any are helpful to the student or scholar who wishes to understand Deleuze or to use his ideas to understand something else, or even, to create a new philosophy? This question is difficult to answer because it raises another question: Do Deleuzians understand Deleuze? Nathan Widder's Reflections on Time and Politics, for example, states that "current philosophies of time often treat Bergson as Deleuze's chief inspiration. Yet is Bergson's insistence on time's continuity not fundamentally incompatible with Deleuze's idea of time as a 'disjunctive synthesis'?" (3) Clearly, Widder thinks that the current scholarship is mistaken and he sets out to correct these errors. Does he succeed?

Widder's book is somewhat difficult to evaluate because it consists of a number of chapters or reflections that are not specifically connected. In other words, it is up to the reader to do the work of connecting the ideas. This has some advantages but it also has limits. The reader can find whatever she wants to find in the text but simultaneously, the author has abandoned the authorial task of telling the reader the purpose each chapter serves in the development of his idea.

Widder's text begins with a chapter on Aristotle's notion of time in which he asserts that Aristotle has two notions of time. One is of the continuous series of indivisible nows which are countable but exist whether we count them or not. The second notion is related to movement and change in which a thing changes but each change is, in Widder's terms, discontinuous with respect to the previous state. Widder maintains that this proves that Aristotle has a notion of time as discontinuous. Although there is certainly something to this, it overlooks Aristotle's idea that each now is a species of the genus now that is the former's substratum and is real. This makes before and after into specific differences, accidental differences in relation to being itself. Time is certainly a multiplicity of successive arrests but, in Aristotle, this means that there is no real motion or change and no conception of difference as real. Instead, there is a structure of genus, species and accidents.

Widder jumps, in the next chapter, to Gilles Deleuze and set theory, relying mostly on the book, What is Philosophy? Once again, the goal seems to be to banish continuity in favor of discontinuity. Widder argues against Dedekind and for Russell that irrational numbers do not fill the continuum between rational numbers and, therefore, that mathematical continuity is truly discontinuous. While it is the case that the so-called mathematical "continuity hypothesis" has not yet been proven, various applications of pure mathematics have been successfully formulated on the basis of continuity. Here, Widder cites Deleuze and Guattari's What is Philosophy? on the plane of immanence of concepts. "The plane [of immanence] envelops infinite movements that pass back and forth through it, but concepts are the infinite speeds of finite movements that, in each case, pass only through their own components" (33). And yet, it is the components of concepts, and not concepts themselves, that are distinct and heterogeneous. So what are concepts? And what is a plane and what is it that passes back and forth on this plane? Widder implies that all of this has something to do with the discontinuity, so in order to proceed we must ask, does it?

As we can see, motion and change are difficult to study mathematically, as the tools of mathematics (numbers, points, lines, equations) are themselves static. Gilles Deleuze takes up developments in the natural sciences and mathematics by proposing a probabilistic but still deterministic philosophy formalized by means of differential calculus and vector fields. Calculus is "a collection of methods to describe and handle patterns of infinity -- the infinitely large and the infinitely small made possible the use of mathematical tools to study motion and change without falling into paradoxes." (Devlin 74). "The basic operation of differential calculus is the process known as differentiation [whose aim is] … to obtain the rate of change of some changing quantity. In order to do this, the 'value' or 'position' or 'path' of that quantity has to be given by means of an appropriate formula" (Devlin 86).

Newton and Leibniz developed the rules for differentiating complicated functions by starting from the formula for a curve and calculating the formula for the gradient (or steepness) of that curve by taking small differences in the x and y directions and computing the gradients of the resulting straight lines -- the gradient function is called the derivative of the original function (Devlin 90). "The crucial step … was to shift attention from the essentially static situation concerning a gradient at a particular point P to the dynamic process of successive approximation of the gradient [of the curve] by gradients of straight lines starting at P" (Devlin 87-88). Nevertheless, it is crucial to remember that the apparently dynamic motion can only be captured, mathematically, by a static function and, likewise, the dynamic process of closer and closer approximation to the gradient must also be captured in a static manner known as a limit, a sequence of approximations (Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 170-182). In other words, for purposes of this application, the field of immanence and the events that take place on it are given as continuous.

To utilize and expand on the possibilities offered by differential calculus, Deleuze proposes an Idea in the Kantian sense insofar as it arises from and regulates its field immanently (Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 177). "Already Leibniz had shown that calculus … expressed problems which could not hitherto be solved or, indeed, even posed (transcendent problems)," problems such as the complete determination of a species of curve, or problems characterized by the paradox of Achilles and the tortoise (Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 177).

But what about determinations beyond a single curve? Is there a means to make "a complete determination with regard to the existence and distribution of … [regular and singular] points which depends upon a completely different instance," an instance characterized in terms of a field of vectors (Devlin 44)? The goal here is to explicitly link differential equations and vector fields. A vector field is defined, by Deleuze, as the complete determination of a problem given in terms of the existence, number and distribution of points that are its condition. This corresponds fairly well to the more or less standard mathematical definition where a vector field is defined as associating a vector to every point in the field space (Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, 177).

Vector fields are used in physics to model observations, such as the movement of a fluid, which include a direction for each point of the observed space. This is particularly important for Deleuze who claims that nature is a vector field. This is what Deleuze calls a plane of immanence. Referring back to the above quote from What is Philosophy?, concepts are singular points on that vector field. They are called attractors. Deleuze and Guattari claim that they attract affects, percepts, functives, and prospects, which are their components and which constitute them, but never absolutely, since such forces only ever approach singularities infinitely without ever being identical to them. Trajectories are the movements of affects, percepts, functives, and prospects as they pass back and forth (forward and backward in time) on this plane of immanence. This is where the speed of light enters the picture (33). How do those affects, percepts, functives, and prospects escape the concepts that attract them? Ideally, they exceed the speed of light and thereby they escape the pull of the singularity.

Rejecting, along with Deleuze, any Hegelian notion of difference understood as contradiction, Widder goes on to Bachelard, who, he argues, claims priority for the instant understood as pure event and "a microscopic or quantum domain of divergences, discontinuities" (42). We should point out that the micro scale and the quantum scale are quite different and operate according to radically different principles. The microscopic can easily be accounted for using Deleuze's model. As we noted, such terms are used in physics to model physical phenomenon such as the motion of fluids which can be described by the rules governing deterministic chaos. Quantum scale is quite different. It describes the relations between energy and matter on the Plank scale, approximately 10 to minus 33 meters. Microscopic phenomenon are described in terms of continuity and discontinuity, a break or gap in continuity. Quantum phenomena are discrete. This is different. They are not discrete within a plane of immanence that is continuous. They are simply discrete, like the rungs of a ladder, and they do not follow the same rules as microscopic phenomena in vector fields. The entire field of quantum gravity has been struggling to reconcile these two models with no luck.

In addition, it's difficult to see what this has to do with Bergson's conflict with Einstein, as Widder implies it does. Is it not the case that Bergson utilizes a classical model of absolute time and space to describe duration and that he argues that it can co-exist with the relative space-time of physical entities? Einstein, it seems, thought this was incomprehensible. Moreover, Bergson suppressed publication of Duration and Simultaneity because he realized that he had misunderstood the nature of Lorenz transformations, the mathematical basis of relativity theory. Deleuze, in Bergsonism, tries to rescue Bergson by translating his ideas into Deleuze's own. Rather than heterogeneous duration, Deleuze interprets Bergson as advocating time as the unchanging form of what moves or changes, in other words, a plane of immanence, a state space which describes the motions of microscopic phenomena.

Deterministic chaos also applies to Deleuze's reading (chapter 5) of Plato’s argument against the conception of time that allows something to be both older and younger than itself at the same time. Deleuze simply argues that for the classical model that describes the microscopic scale particles can change direction and reverse themselves, so pure becoming can move in both directions and thus undermines the possibility of Platonic forms. Moreover (chapter 6), Deleuze ultimately upholds the law of non-contradiction. The rules governing state space or vector fields are the same as those utilized in binary logic. This includes the law of non-contradiction. In this field, different forces are simply different singularities or attractors that organize the field. From this point of view, there is little difference between Deleuze and Lacan (chapter 7), except for the privilege Lacan attributes to the phallus, the signifier or attractor that organizes the social field as a totality.

For Deleuze, however, it is not the phallus but the axiomatic of capital which deterritorializes codes and transforms all value into money (chapter 8). Contrary to Widder's claim, Deleuze makes ample use of Kantian categories, the categories of relation to be precise, with the proviso that the "I think" need not accompany any of our representations. Capitalism liberates the flows of desire, when desire is understood to be the immanent binary -- linear sphere of differentiations, in other words, the sphere of differential relations. This takes place under the social conditions that define the limit insofar as liberated desire is posited to be one with unlimited qualitative becoming. It is entirely the manner in which desire, the unlimited becoming, is temporally synthesized, that is, associated, conjoined and distributed, that determines whether it forms human subjects, works of art or social institutions (Deleuze and Guattari, Anti-Oedipus, 224).

The capitalist machine establishes itself by bringing distribution expressed as conjunction to the fore in the social machine (Deleuze and Guattari, Anti-Oedipus, 224). Desire is distributed and conjunction is the pattern of its distribution. As nature is distributive, every conjunction may be transformed by the power of nature to break apart what has been connected, transforming every and … and … and into or … or … or. Conjunction, as logically reformulated, immanently, is "the power of things to exist one by one without any possibility of them being gathered together in a unity, a whole (Deleuze, The Logic of Sense, 266-267). Conjunction is the if … then that is so easily torn apart, separated into distinct events, each one a limit. As such, it appears that capitalism is ontologically prescribed.

Chapters 9 through 18 seem to represent the heart of Widder's argument i.e., that Deleuze's idea of time as a "disjunctive synthesis" represents a concept of time as discontinuous and makes identity an illusion. To some extent, this is correct since conjunction/disjunction (transformable into one another through the logical rules of replacement) is the logical and ontological power to break apart whatever has been connected, but is the outcome of this what Widder seems to imply?

Disjunction is both a mathematical and a logical rule. As such, it is far from non-sense (108). Sense is a linguistic category, the pure expression of that which is without reference; it is the expression of an Idea, thus it is not a disjunctive synthesis as Widder states (110). Certainly, disjunctive synthesis, if it is ontological and not just logical, would deterritorialize all power relations (120), but would thereby leave all things at the mercy of the axiomatic force of capital. Moreover, is it will to power or something else that expresses the conflict of forces (127)? Deleuze points to the co-existence of contraries. In its confusion over sensible contradictions, the I think must call upon the faculty of concepts and the faculty of Ideas to make sense of what is utter nonsense (contradiction). Thus perplexed, driven by contradiction, lacking the unity of an I Think, lacking any sensible, which is to say, empirical recognition in a concept, practical reason comes forth grasping whatever in the world concerns it and brings it into being. What is it that the faculties can do? What faculties can do is a matter of practical power, of will, of desire. The power of an I Think is an illusion; the power of will freed of the I Think is a power that freely produces the world -- without subjects, without objects. Only the power of the virtual, the power of abstract production, will itself, desire itself, is real, but this is one with inertia, that is, the death instinct (141), the idea that a body in motion stays in motion until overtaken by another force. In this Deleuze and Freud agree.

As the individual loses identity, what is left? Art (chapter 14). Quoting Adorno, Widder claims that thinking men and artists feel that they are not quite there, that they are just spectators and, indeed, lack identity. Indeed, this is true: not sublimation, but simply the power of desire, of will freed of an I think. Not surprisingly, lacking any molar formation of identity, what is left would be the power of microscopic particles (161) against which macroscopic resistance is fruitless (164). Perhaps we should not be surprised then when Widder turns to eternal return, which puts into play the logical rules of replacement, transforming every I willed it into an I am not responsible for the past, the restoration of innocence, since I am not even an I (174). This is, it seems to me, one of the obvious implications of the loss of identity. When all codes are torn apart, when causality no longer holds, then historical action as well as personal responsibility are impossible. If this is the message and the effect of a Deleuzian liberation of identity, then perhaps we need to slow down a bit and decide if this is a world worth living in. We know Deleuze's answer, but what is our own?


Devlin, Keith. Mathematics: The Science of Patterns (New York: Scientiļ¬c American Library, 1994).

Deleuze, Gilles. Difference and Repetition, tr. Paul Patton (New York: Columbia University Press, 1994).

Deleuze, Gilles. The Logic of Sense, tr. Mark Lester, with Charles Stivale; ed. Constantin V. Boundas (New York: Columbia University Press, 1990).

Deleuze, Gilles and Félix Guattari. Anti-Oedipus, tr. Robert Hurley, Mark Seem, and Helen R. Lane (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1987).