Reflective Knowledge: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume II

Placeholder book cover

Ernest Sosa, Reflective Knowledge: Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge, Volume II, Oxford UP, 2009, xiii + 254 pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199217250.

Reviewed by Frederick F. Schmitt, Indiana University



Ernest Sosa’s Apt Belief and Reflective Knowledge is a two-volume work elaborating Sosa’s well known distinction between animal knowledge and reflective knowledge. The first volume, A Virtue Epistemology, consists of Sosa’s Locke lectures at Oxford in 2005 and focuses on animal knowledge, while the second volume, Reflective Knowledge, is the subject of the present review and treats reflective knowledge.1 The latter volume weaves together in an engaging style material from several important recently published papers by Sosa (with the addition of new material in chapter 10). The volume is divided into two parts: critical studies of accounts of knowledge that bear on the character of reflective knowledge (Part I) and Sosa’s own account of reflective knowledge (Part II). I focus here on Sosa’s positive account in Part II.

In recent epistemology it is much debated whether knowledge requires reliable belief or something else, particularly something internal, such as coherent belief or recognition of reliability. Sosa doubts that this is a fruitful debate and proposes that accounts of knowledge presented as rivals are better seen as offering diverse conditions each of which has a claim to characterizing knowledge in some sense and each of which has value in its own right. Just which conditions we take seriously as candidates for knowledge in some sense will be determined by which conditions are clearly valuable (e.g., have a surplus value over true belief). The procedure of identifying conditions of knowledge with an eye to value will have the benefit of ensuring that the identified conditions explain the value we assign to knowledge. Recognizing the separate value of the chosen conditions is, however, compatible with seeing their value as deeply related, and Sosa tells an interesting story about how the value of coherent belief in reflective knowledge is related to that of reliable belief in animal knowledge.

Animal knowledge according to Sosa requires apt belief — i.e., belief that is “correct attributably to a competence exercised in appropriate conditions” (vol. 1, p. 93): “its correctness derives from manifesting certain cognitive virtues of the subject, where nothing is a cognitive virtue unless it is a truth-conducive disposition” (vol. 2, p. 135). This is a reliability account of animal knowledge. But Sosa argues (in volume 1) that it is essential to refer to epistemic competence or virtue and not to a reliable process, as on most versions of reliabilism, because only the requirement of competence explains why knowledge is more valuable than mere true belief.

Though very valuable, animal knowledge does not capture everything that goes under the heading of knowledge. This is evident, Sosa says, from the fact that something pertinent to knowledge is missing from my cognition if, despite my having animal knowledge that p, my best answer to whether I know that p is “Maybe I do and maybe I don’t.” In this case, there is a sense in which I don’t know that p. I lack reflective knowledge, and animal knowledge without reflective knowledge is “like lucking into some benefit in the dark” (p. 142).2 There is a sense of knowledge that requires an ability to answer whether I have animal knowledge. The task of Part II of Reflective Knowledge is to explain the value and possibility of knowledge in this sense.

In Chapter 7 Sosa understands reflective knowledge that p as requiring not only animal knowledge that p but also “that under the light of reflection one must be able to defend the reliability of one’s sources” for the belief that p (p. 139). Does Sosa mean that reflective knowledge requires, in addition to apt belief that p, only that one would be able to defend that the source of the belief p is reliable if one were to reflect? I think not. Accompanied only by the ability to defend the belief, animal knowledge that p would still be lucking into a benefit in the dark; one would merely have the ability to turn on the light. So I take Sosa to have in mind that one does believe that the belief p is reliable (or perhaps more, that the belief p is apt) as a result of reflection and this second-order belief results from a competence in matters of reliability. If this is right, then reflective knowledge that p is apt belief that p accompanied by apt belief that the source of one’s belief p is reliable. The reference to reflection is then derivative from the basic account of reflective knowledge; reflection on whether the source of the belief p is reliable is required because such reflection is necessary for the manifestation of competence on the matter whether the source of the belief p is reliable. (Of course, even adding accompaniment by an apt second-order belief does not prevent animal knowledge under reflection from being lucky in a sense, since it does not ensure that the subject is guided to the belief p, or retains that belief, as a result of believing that the source of the belief p is reliable. Nevertheless it does ensure that the animal knowledge obtains in the light rather than the dark.) I take it that the reflection in reflective knowledge is normally of the ordinary sort that involves self-conscious consideration of the status of one’s belief. It includes as a special case philosophical reflection on the possibility of error, as in reflection on skeptical doubts like the dream or demon hypotheses.

Sosa traces the surplus value of reflective knowledge over animal knowledge to the fact that beliefs about reliability facilitate the retention of true beliefs and the retraction of false beliefs. First, we may employ reflective beliefs about reliability (and associated beliefs about unreliability) to guide the retention or retraction of first-order beliefs. If some beliefs revised under guidance originated from unreliable sources, and one’s beliefs that the sources of the guided beliefs are reliable or unreliable are generally true (as is guaranteed for those second-order beliefs in reflective knowledge), and the guidance is sufficiently systematic, the average reliability and thus the ratio of truths of the guided beliefs will tend to increase.

Second, converting animal knowledge that p to reflective knowledge that p enhances the epistemic status of this animal knowledge. Sosa is not exact about what epistemic status is increased, but he makes it clear that the increase in status derives from an increase in the coherence of beliefs. Sosa gestures here towards a common coherentist view. On this view, there is an increase in the support enjoyed by the first-order belief that p in virtue of the addition of the second-order belief about the reliability of the sources of that belief. The first-order belief is supported because it fits (in a logical sense) the second-order belief. Conversely, the second-order belief is supported by the first-order belief in virtue of its fit to the first-order belief. Support for both the first-order and second-order beliefs is increased further to the extent that the second-order belief is supported by other first-order beliefs. These other first-order beliefs enjoy a relation of mutual support to the given first-order belief through their relation of mutual support to the second-order belief.

Sosa, I have suggested, aims not only to recognize the separate value in animal and reflective knowledge, but also to give a unified account of the value of each. How, then, does he unify the value of apt or reliable belief and that of the coherence involved in reflective knowledge? He derives the value of coherence from that of reliability. The increase in the epistemic status of reflective knowledge owing to an increase in coherence has value because the guidance of our first-order beliefs by our second-order beliefs increases the reliability of our first-order beliefs. Sosa analogizes the procedure involved in this guidance to Descartes’ hypothetico-deductive method of adopting the hypothesis that closely fits a large body of data, and he cites Descartes’ reliabilist explanation of the epistemic status of the method: Descartes

notes that if he can make coherent sense of a long stretch of otherwise undecipherable writing by supposing that it is written in ‘one-off language’, with the alphabet all switched forward by one letter, etc., the fact that he can make sense of the passage through that interpretation supports the hypothesis that it is correct. There [Principles 205] he defends his account of physical reality in that ’ … it would hardly have been possible for so many items to fall into a coherent pattern if the original principles had been false’ (p. 143).

The parallel claim for retaining or retracting beliefs in light of our recognition of reliability would be this: we start out believing our first-order beliefs, then observe that their truth (and the falsity of what is contrary to them) closely fits the hypothesis that our sources are reliable (and that any sources yielding contrary beliefs are unreliable); we adopt this hypothesis; we then proceed to retain or retract beliefs according to whether they fit the hypothesis; we see that this method is reliable in the reliability beliefs it retains because it would hardly have been possible for so many first-order beliefs that fit the hypothesis to be true if the hypothesis that our sources are reliable had been false; and if this method is reliable (i.e., if it is hardly possible that our reliability beliefs are false), the average reliability of the first-order beliefs under guidance tends to increase. In short, the status of animal knowledge is enhanced in reflective knowledge because reflection is a reliable method for retaining reliability beliefs and thus enhances the average reliability of guided first-order beliefs. To the extent that these claims are plausible, Sosa can reconcile his coherentist explanation of the increase in epistemic status enjoyed by reflective knowledge with his reliabilism about animal knowledge, tracing the separate value of each to the same ultimate root. However, I note that in Chapter 9 Sosa offers a rather different and less unifying explanation of the value of reflection: “when combined with external competence,” coherence between first-order and reliability beliefs “gives us a more comprehensive grasp of the truth than we would have in its absence” (p. 191). Here, as I take it, Sosa proposes that the addition of reliability beliefs that fit animal knowledge increases the comprehensiveness of true beliefs in the sense that it increases the domain of objects of our true beliefs (or perhaps the amount of semantical or informational content in our true beliefs).

After presenting his view of reflective knowledge and its value in chapter 7, Sosa turns in chapters 8, 9, and 10 to the question of whether the role of beliefs about reliability in reflective knowledge is viciously circular. In chapter 8 and part of chapter 9, he responds to Barry Stroud’s objection to an externalist account of knowledge like Sosa’s, that it cannot give a fully general explanation of knowledge. Stroud argues that such an account understands knowledge as meeting an external condition (such as reliability), but explaining knowledge requires seeing oneself as having a reason to believe one’s account and thus to believe that the external condition is met. Since this presupposes that one has knowledge that the condition is met, it precludes a fully general explanation. Sosa convincingly responds to this objection by pointing out that on Stroud’s argument the impossibility of an externalist account is a simple logical consequence of the requirement of a fully general explanation in Stroud’s sense: “Why should that [failure to explain knowledge in the way Stroud requires] be frustrating when it is the inevitable consequence of its [the question’s] generality?” (p. 200). If Stroud could show that an account of knowledge that falls short of general explanation fails an essential ambition of epistemology, his case against externalist accounts would be telling. He might say that to fall short of generality is to give up the pressing project of selecting knowledge-producing sources from among all possible sources we might employ without relying on some sources for the selection. One might doubt that this selection project makes sense. Even if it does, it would seem to have a pressing motivation only if we place little confidence in the sources we prereflectively use, or we aim for a certainty that disqualifies a source about which we have the slightest doubt. Luckily we are not in the former position, and to disqualify even slightly doubtful sources is to show an unmotivated preference for avoiding error over acquiring true beliefs. Now, Stroud does offer an account of knowledge (or rather of how we know that we know) that may meet the generality requirement. On his account, we directly perceive that we know, rather than know that we know by knowing that an external condition is met. But Sosa makes several telling points against this account. I would add to Sosa’s response to Stroud’s objection the observation that the epistemic circularity of reflective knowledge (our unavoidable reliance on our sources to establish their reliability) clearly does not stand in the way of two sorts of value that Sosa ascribes to reflective knowledge. It does not prevent coherence from increasing the reliability of our beliefs nor from increasing their comprehensiveness.

In Chapter 10 Sosa tackles the problem of easy knowledge. The problem arises, in Sosa’s formulation, because it is implausible “that one should be entirely lacking in epistemic status for the relevant implicit commitments about the propitiousness of one’s situation (and the generic reliability of one’s source) in believing that one sees a red wall”; “that one should then become justified epistemically in believing that one does see a red wall … without yet being at all justified in one’s commitments”; and "that then, based on one’s belief about the wall’s color … one should thereby acquire the relevant justification … for hosting those commitments" (pp. 232-3). The relevant commitments are of two kinds: specific reliability commitments like “The first-order belief that the wall is red is not formed in a misleading way,” and generic reliability commitments like “The source of this first-order belief is reliable.” The problem is one of circularity: the justification of the first-order belief about the red wall requires that the reliability commitment be simultaneously justified, yet it seems that the commitment can only be justified on the basis of the first-order belief (or other first-order beliefs produced by the source). As I read him, Sosa responds to the circularity in this way. He grants that it is implausible “that unreflective justification for one’s explicit or implicit commitments should be generated entirely through reasoning based on [first-order] beliefs acquired only through unjustified … commitments” (p. 239). But reflective justification for the commitments can depend on first-order beliefs without justified commitments, for reflective justification can induce coherence among the first-order beliefs and the commitments. This is enough to provide some degree of justification for the commitments without any prior justification of those commitments.

Sosa’s response to the circularity assumes that a lack of initial justification of the commitments stands in the way of a noncoherence justification of the commitments based on the first-order beliefs, but it does not stand in the way of a coherence justification of the commitments. Presumably this is so because a coherence justification of the commitments does not presuppose but induces the justification of the first-order beliefs, while a noncoherence justification presupposes the justification of the first-order beliefs, in turn requiring the prior justification of the accompanying commitments. I think this presumption would be plausible if in a noncoherence justification the first-order beliefs had themselves to be justified on the basis of the accompanying commitments. That would entail a vicious circularity of basing: the commitments would then be justified on the basis of the commitments. There is no reason, however, to say that the first-order beliefs in a noncoherence justification must be justified on the basis of the commitments, any more than they are in a coherence justification. If the justification of the first-order beliefs merely requires accompaniment by justified commitments rather than basing on them, it does so in a coherence as well as a noncoherence justification. But in that case, there is a circularity in the coherence justification as well. This leads me to think that it is better to respond to the problem of easy knowledge not by adverting to coherence justification as Sosa does, but simply by denying that the justification of the first-order beliefs requires any justification of the accompanying commitments — indeed, by denying that any commitments need accompany the first-order beliefs.

I have focused on Sosa’s account of reflective knowledge in Part II. This leaves out a great deal of valuable material, which I can do no more than cite here. Chapter 1 contains the most sensible interpretation of Moore’s proof of an external world that I have seen. There is a forceful rejection of Strawson’s naturalism in chapter 2, of Reid’s common sense approach to skepticism in chapter 3, of Sellars’s rejection of the given in chapter 4, and of Davidson’s coherentism in chapter 5. These critical discussions are among the most insightful treatments of these topics in the literature.

It should go without saying that Sosa’s book is essential reading for anyone with even a passing interest in contemporary epistemology. His distinction between animal and reflective knowledge is a fundamental contribution to the field. The approach he sketches in this readable book is important and defensible. I know of no more plausible approach, no more accessible presentation.

1 See the review of volume 1 by Ram Neta in Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, 2008.05.04,

2 From here on all page references are to volume 2.