Reflexive Democracy: Political Equality and the Welfare State

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Kevin Olson, Reflexive Democracy: Political Equality and the Welfare State, MIT Press, 2006, 249pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262151162.

Reviewed by Neve Gordon, Ben-Gurion University of the Negev, Israel


Kevin Olson's Reflexive Democracy is a noble attempt to transcend the pervasive conception of the welfare state as a redistributive and regulatory mechanism that functions as a counterweight to capitalist economies. The book sets out to contest the belief that welfare exists solely in order to pursue a narrow set of social ideals defined in opposition to the economy, and aims instead to put the welfare state on more solid grounds, made up of "firmer normative claims about what the state should be doing and how it should be doing it" (13). Welfare, Olson argues, should be conceived as an enabling institution for realizing collective goals such as popular sovereignty, political inclusion, and equal opportunity, rather than one that simply redistributes goods.

The book's objective, then, is to provide a new form of justification for welfare founded upon what the author calls reflexive democracy. Reflexive democracy consists of a cluster of interconnected practices, procedures and concepts, including the "participatory ideal, reflexive citizenship, reflexive legitimacy, and the idea that agency should be seen as a matter of capabilities evaluated from political, cultural and economic perspectives" (207). The notion of reflexivity emerges from the idea that democratic politics must sustain the very conditions of equality that make it possible. Thus, Olson's central point, as I understand it, is that while reflexive democracy should serve as the basis for welfare -- understood not only as a package of goods but also as a series of procedures and practices that ensure political equality -- welfare is also the condition of the possibility of reflexive democracy. Welfare, he tells us,

is a vital mechanism for ensuring that all citizens have the means to participate as equals. Participation, however, is vital for articulating needs and interests in forming welfare law. On the one hand, welfare is necessary to ensure equal and sufficient participation in forming the laws. On the other hand, equal and sufficient participation is necessary to legitimate the system of laws that includes welfare. (189)

Although Olson's effort is noble, his book has two central problems: one is praxis-related and the other is theoretical. In terms of practice, Olson continuously promises to connect his claims to our world's grim reality yet he never really delivers. Although he does discuss recent welfare policies in the United States in a few places, the discussion remains abstract and does not uncover the causes and processes leading to the attack against the poor. Indeed, the book has little if anything to say about the power relations informing the contemporary assault on welfare. Power as a form of social domination, control, and management hardly figures into the discussion, rendering the effort to provide a normative justification for the welfare state conjectural. The book, in other words, creates a utopian fantasy since its strategy for change is dissociated from the political, economic, social and cultural forces that currently shape western states. As a result, the analysis remains, for the most part, inconsequential for those who have paid the direct price of the welfare cutbacks as well as for the activists who have attempted to oppose the ongoing assault.

The inadequacy of the practical dimension is intricately tied to the book's theoretical framework. Olson's claims are informed by Habermas's notion of "private autonomy," a fiction that assumes the human subject is or can be an unencumbered self. The notion that humans are autonomous agents or at least can become autonomous agents informs practically all of Olson's arguments.

Olson suggests, for instance, that in any attempt to justify and define the social rights provided by the state "it is very important that all citizens affected by them have a substantive role in deliberation" (119). According to Habermas, he continues,

the discourse justifying and forming systems of social rights requires the autonomous participation of all those affected by them … Full, autonomous participation is necessary to ensure that all are fairly represented in the consensus that is reached as a result of public deliberation, and further, that those most in need of social rights have been able to articulate their own needs and interests. If those most affected by social rights do not participate in their formulation, then such rights are not, strictly speaking, democratically legitimate. Even more importantly they run the risk of being irrelevant or missing their mark, because the contextually specific input of people needing social rights has not been adequately taken into account. (119)

Olson, to be sure, understands that full, autonomous participation is a paradoxical ideal, "because it presupposes equal agency at the same time that it seeks to promote it" (113). Yet he does not recognize that part of the reason it is unrealizable is due to its being founded upon a false conception of the human subject. Full participation is impossible, he claims, "because the people that social rights are designed to help are precisely those who are not autonomous, those who lack some of the means necessary to participate fully in public deliberation" (119). Hence, in Olson's view there are people who are autonomous, people who can operate outside the dominant norms and power relations prevalent in their society.

The false notion of the autonomous subject is at the heart of Olson's argument about reflexive democracy. He highlights, for example, the importance of "voice" and "exit" for advancing participation and overcoming exploitation. Voice allows people to raise claims about moral norms and argue for their adoption (50), while exit serves as a form of security against exploitation. Exploitation is made possible, he maintains, when a person's exit options are curtailed (49). Early in the discussion Olson admits that racism creates exploitable vulnerabilities and is not something from which one can "exit" (53). He fails, however, to reflect about the implications of such a claim on the notion of the autonomous voice, while later on in the book he returns to underscore the importance of exit as a significant category for his model despite the acknowledgment that exit is often an impossibility. Ironically, he does so in the chapter that highlights the "feminist paradigm."

It is ironic that Olson emphasizes "exit" as a viable and necessary condition for overcoming exploitation and achieving participation, because one of the major contributions of feminists like Judith Butler (whom he cites in the chapter) is that the very intelligibility of the subject is dependent on the prior operation of norms circulating in society, a notion that renders both voice and exit in the Olsonian sense ultimately untenable.  The repetition of norms, Butler teaches us, necessarily precedes the emergence of the subject and initiates the subject into the dominant social order.  Thus, in any given society, a subject's identity only becomes recognizable and coherent to her/himself and to other members of society through specific norms. Olson's notion of voice and exit presupposes a subject that precedes the norm and can somehow act outside of it. The same is true for his notion of reflexive citizenship and social cooperation.  So while his desire for a reflexive democracy is morally and normatively commendable, the argument he advances in order to justify it is like a castle built on sand.