Reforming the Art of Living: Nature, Virtue, and Religion in Descartes's Epistemology

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Rico Vitz, Reforming the Art of Living: Nature, Virtue, and Religion in Descartes's Epistemology, Springer, 2015, 154pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319052809.

Reviewed by Tarek R. Dika, University of Michigan, Ann Arbor


In nine short and clearly written chapters, Rico Vitz offers his readers a number of worthwhile observations about Descartes's epistemology and moral philosophy, but does so in service of a thesis that calls into question why he bothered writing a book on Descartes in the first place. He begins by arguing that Descartes "develops a comprehensive account of virtuous belief formation" in the Discourse, Meditations, and subsequent treatises (7). This is the most promising and, fortunately, longest part of the book, encompassing Chapters 2-6. In Chapter 7, Vitz asserts, without any serious argument, that Descartes's account of virtuous belief formation "fails to deliver on its promise of providing a new and lasting foundation for the sciences" (7, 83-85.). Indeed, he argues that "Descartes's philosophical program -- and, more specifically, his account of virtuous belief formation -- is, in fact, significant not because it helps him achieve his scientific aims," but rather "because it allows Descartes to suggest a way to reform and, in his estimation, improve Christianity in a manner that would be appealing to educated modern, Western Europeans" (125). This is not a criterion by which Descartes or any Descartes scholar I know of would evaluate the success of his philosophical program. Be that as it may, Vitz concludes that "Descartes's philosophical program is antithetical to traditional Christianity" (125), defined as "the first-millennium Christianity of the Greek-speaking part of the ancient Near East" (6). In short, Descartes's "program is an attempt to influence subsequent scholars not merely to reform traditional Christianity but, in fact, to subvert both it and other similarly traditional religions" (125). What starts as a relatively promising book on Descartes's epistemology and moral philosophy ends up resembling Voetius's condemnation of Descartes's philosophy at the University of Utrecht in 1642 (Vitz cites Voetius's condemnation on p. 90, which sincerely asks whether Descartes's doctrines are "dangerous, in the sense that they threaten to undermine Christian morality").

The strongest part of the book can be found in Chapters 2-6. In Chapter 2, Vitz considers the question, "Who is the Cartesian Meditator?" in the Meditations and examines four proposed answers: a philosophically naïve person of common sense, a skeptic, a scholastic Aristotelian, and an amalgam of all three. Drawing on the tradition of Jesuit, Ignatian spirituality with which Descartes was familiar, Vitz rejects all four proposals, arguing instead that "unlike the author of a work of philosophical fiction, [Descartes] intends for the reader to see the first-person personal pronoun as referring to himself or to herself, not to some other, fictional person" (18). Vitz's argument is cogent, and similar such arguments can be found in the secondary literature he cites (Étienne Gilson, L. J. Beck, Edwin Curley, Walter Strohrer, Amy Schmitter). By inviting the reader to identify with the first-person personal pronoun, "Descartes is genuinely concerned not merely with what his readers come to believe but also with how they come to believe" (20).

This sets the stage for Chapter 3, where Vitz develops an account of "the nature of belief" and "the proper method of belief formation" according to Descartes (28). Regarding belief, Vitz argues that Descartes distinguishes between two kinds of beliefs, which he retrospectively refers to in Chapter 5 as "judgments and dispositional, or habitual, beliefs" (65). To believe a proposition, a person has to have a mental representation of the proposition and assent to or affirm the proposition (25). Such beliefs are judgments, "which, at least on Descartes's account, are mental acts" involving "both a cognitive element and a volitional element" (25), much along the lines of Principles of Philosophy I. 34 (cited by Vitz on 24-25). For Vitz, Descartes employs the Latin terms affirmo, credo, nego to refer to judgments. Habitual beliefs, by contrast, are beliefs that can be attributed to a person "even when he is not attending to the propositions" (25), in which case they are not occurrent mental acts, but rather mental dispositions. Vitz identifies Descartes's concept of "a consuetudinem credendi  -- a phrase that translators render as 'habitual belief,' 'habit of believing,' or 'habitual tendency to believe'," citing the Cottingham, Haldane-Ross, and Blom translations, respectively (26), all of them from Meditations III.

Although I find questionable Vitz's thesis that Descartes distinguishes between judgments and habitual beliefs as two kinds of belief (they are two ways of having a belief, not two kinds of belief), he compellingly argues that, for Descartes, "a person who seeks after the truth must meditate repeatedly during the course of his or her enquiry so that his or her judgments may become habitual, or dispositional, beliefs" (29). His interpretation of Descartes's four rules of method in Discourse II, although very schematic and more or less traditional, is enriched by the concept of habitual belief formation. Certainly, the practice of meditation would be entirely useless were it unable to transform and, eventually, replace those cognitive habits that corrupt the employment of the intellect and, therefore, forbid the possibility of scientia. Unfortunately, Vitz skirts the question regarding the relation between the four rules of method in Discourse II (where Descartes does not recommend doubt) and the "method of universal doubt" prescribed in Meditations, drawing what are at best superficial similarities between the two (28-31). He ends Chapter 3 by reminding his readers that, for Descartes, "one should be able not only to unmask the beauty of the sciences but also to raise one's nature to a higher degree of perfection" (35), effectively drawing on Descartes's originally intended title for the Discourse: "The Plan of a Universal Science which is capable of raising our Nature to its Highest Degree of Perfection . . . " "Thus," Vitz concludes, "Descartes's proper method of belief formation is a normative method with [ . . . ] a distinctive, ethical focus on human excellence, or virtue" (35). This is a welcome observation, which Vitz elaborates in Chapters 4-6.

In Chapters 4-5, Vitz defines Descartes's concept of morality as an "art of natural beatitude" that is "truly cosmopolitan" insofar as "he [Descartes] intends [it] to be useful for every person -- Christian, Jew, 'Turk,' pagan, and so forth" (40). Wasting a good bit of time shadow boxing against unidentified commentators who "identify his [Descartes's] account of morality as 'Stoic'" (he cites not one commentator who holds this view), Vitz, citing Descartes's definition of virtue in Passions III. 161 as "habits in the soul which dispose it to have certain thoughts," argues that, for Descartes, philosophical wisdom, the highest virtue, may be acquired by

(i) the control of one's attention, by which a person can inhibit the influence of his or her passions, and (ii) the regulation of one's assent, by which a person can no only inhibit the influence of his or her passions but also (iii) eradicate or fix his or her habitual beliefs" (51)

This maps onto the method of virtuous belief formation in the sciences: "One begins, in the process of enquiry, by attending to the relevant ideas. One continues, in the process of judgment, to assent to true ideas. One concludes, in the process of belief fixation, by developing habitual beliefs" (51). Thus far, Vitz has offered the reader little more than what s/he would expect from a superficial overview of aspects of Descartes's moral philosophy. He does not exhibit any intimate familiarity with the secondary literature directly relevant to his argument: Genevieve Rodis-Lewis, John Marshall, and Denis Kambouchner, for example, are not discussed in any detail. There is not much originality here, and readers expecting a fresh interpretation based on serious engagements with the secondary literature are likely to be disappointed.

Vitz begins Chapter 5, "Virtuous Belief Formation," by arguing that "Descartes's conception of virtuous enquiry relies on a distinction between foundational enquiry and ordinary enquiry" (53). "Foundational enquiry" encompasses the sorts of propositions Descartes discusses in Meditations. Lest the reader be at a loss for how to identify what sorts of propositions are encompassed by "ordinary enquiry," Vitz offers the following examples:

propositions such as given the current state of the economy, investing money in bonds is likely the best means of ensuring that I can retire by the age of 65, or attending Stanton College Preparatory School would provide the best secondary education for my sons. (53-54)

How knowledge of the existence of God, the difference between mind and body, and the laws of nature are supposed to inform such mundane considerations as these is difficult to fathom, and yet this is precisely what Vitz argues Descartes requires: "as Descartes sees it, people ought to make ordinary enquiries against the background of some set of propositions that the enquirer believes, and each of these propositions either is or is [sic] dependent upon a proposition believed on the basis of some fundamental inquiry" (58). Such a model of practical reasoning is nowhere to be found in any of Descartes's treatises. Vitz cites Discourse VI as textual support for the distinction between "fundamental" and "ordinary" enquiry, but in the passage cited, Descartes writes that knowledge of nature is desirable "not only for the invention of innumerable devices which would facilitate our enjoyment of the fruits of the earth," but "most importantly, for the maintenance of health." In short, Descartes is referring to how other sciences (mechanics and medicine, respectively) may be perfected by knowledge of physical phenomena, and there is not the slightest hint of Vitz's distinction between "fundamental" and "ordinary" enquiry, let alone the sort of dependency relation he envisages as obtaining between them.

Furthermore, regarding "fundamental inquiry," Vitz argues that "Descartes, like his scholastic predecessors, contends that the sciences are comprehensively hierarchically connected," and cites a text commentators since the 1930s (Cassirer, Beck, Jean-Luc Marion, etc.) long ago identified as evidence of a radical difference between Descartes and his scholastic predecessors and contemporaries: Rule 1 of Rules for the Direction of the Mind. Descartes's concept of scientific unity is defined in terms of a single method or set of rules for acquiring certain knowledge in all sciences, irrespective of subject-matter. For Aristotle, Thomas, and the late scholastics of the sixteenth and early seventeenth centuries (e.g., Suárez and the Conimbricenses), every science has a distinct subject, to which there correspond distinct first principles and demonstrations. There is no one method for acquiring certain knowledge in all sciences, and certainly no one set of metaphysical principles from which, e.g., all the principles of physics may be deduced, as one finds in Descartes's Le Monde or Principles of Philosophy (see Daniel Garber's Descartes' Metaphysical Physics). Curious readers are encouraged to have a look at the literature I mentioned above. To be sure, Vitz is perfectly free to disagree with the literature on any topic he desires, but doing so minimally requires that he be familiar with it, and he frequently demonstrates that he is not.

In Chapters 7 and 8, Vitz clears himself of the responsibility of responding to some of the traditional and contemporary objections to Descartes' epistemology, preferring to reproduce them (see 85), and merely goes on to suppose that, even if these objections could be sustained, Descartes' philosophical program would still have a "social significance" (85). The problem, of course, is that Vitz would rather accept, or at least not bother to challenge, any of the usual criticisms of Descartes and move on to what interests him most:

I will contend that even if Descartes is not an atheist, his account of virtuous belief formation subversively aims at reforming traditional Christianity, thereby paving the way for subsequent philosophers to make bolder attempts at naturalizing not only Christianity but religion, in general. (94)

Identifying Descartes as the modern progenitor of the naturalization of religion is bizarre indeed (Hume is a far more obvious candidate), but Vitz argues that Descartes initiates such attempts at naturalization because the supernatural does not play the role it plays in traditional Christianity in Descartes's cosmopolitan concept of morality (see 97-120). Following Vitz is difficult here, as his aims border on the dogmatic and polemical. But regardless of how one reacts to Chapter 8, "The Subversion of Traditional Christianity," there is simply no sound inference from Descartes's not having a traditionally Christian morality to his consciously having advocated an explanation of religious belief in terms of psychological mechanisms à la Hume. In choosing to write a book about Descartes in order to charge him with having intended to subvert traditional Christianity, Vitz places his book in a genre of writing that belongs to seventeenth-century polemics about Descartes's "dangerous doctrines" (see 89). The basic problem with Vitz's principle thesis is that there is no special reason why Descartes ought to function as the Trojan horse by which to establish it. When Vitz finally sets out to demonstrate why Descartes is particularly significant to what he refers to as the "subversion" of Christianity in the modern period, he offers no more than two figures who wrote after Descartes and who embraced methodologies very, very different from anything Descartes embraced: Spinoza, with his historico-critical method, and Kant, with his critique of metaphysics and subjection of religion to practical reason. Neither of these methods have anything directly to do with Descartes. All in all, the best parts of this book could and should have been developed further and are very much worth reading, but the principle thesis would have been more credibly defended against those philosophers Vitz (wrongly, in my view) argues Descartes influenced, rather than against Descartes himself.