Refractions of Reality: Philosophy and the Moving Image

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John Mullarkey, Refractions of Reality: Philosophy and the Moving Image, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 282pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230002470.

Reviewed by Joseph Mai, Clemson University


Since the invention of the cinématographe at the end of the 19th century, a striking number of thinkers have taken a serious philosophical interest (sometimes exhibited as anxiety) in the ability to create and project moving photographic images. Over the years important authors such as Henri Bergson, Siegfried Kracauer, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, André Bazin, Gilles Deleuze, Stanley Cavell and others have returned to film over and over in their writings. Their investigations implicitly posed a curious set of questions that have come up more explicitly and insistently in recent film philosophy: Can films think? If so, how does film think? What are the implications of a film "mind" for philosophy? In his very original book, Refractions of Reality, John Mullarkey tackles these questions, but first approaches them through a diagnosis of the source of philosophical interest in them. For Mullarkey the persistence of such questions is symptomatic of a certain anxiety among philosophers. What he calls "film-envy" follows from the fact that both philosophy and film are concerned to describe reality (ix). The idea that film might think about reality, and in a different way than philosophy does, resounds with all the potential benefits and possible fears of the democratization of thought.

A philosopher and editor of Film-Philosophy, Mullarkey brings an informed, critical view to a number of theories from both the Continental tradition (his specialization) and the Anglo-American tradition (slightly less represented here). To make his critique, he develops a Bergson-inflected theory of film viewing as an event. He alludes to this position throughout the book, but does not explicitly hash it out until the second part. It first appears within a general discussion of the relation between what we know and what exists, and Mullarkey twice quotes a substantial passage from Ian Jarvies on the seemingly insurmountable difficulties involved in making a clear demarcation between the two. To extract himself from this problem, Mullarkey asserts that film has an élan cinématique (not the most beautiful expression in the book) on the model of Bergson's élan vital. Film should be thought of as a multiplicity of social, mental, and biological processes through which viewer and film are co-created. Film for Mullarkey involves qualitative change and becoming rather than definable essences. Since Mullarkey saves much of his position for the end, my review will first provide a roadmap of how that position leads to a critique of other theories.

Mullarkey starts with a short dismissal of philosophers who use film as "staged abstractions" for pedagogical purposes (chapter 1). He then turns to bigger game, beginning with David Bordwell's writings (chapter 2), which he considers as a defense and illustration of the "cognitivist paradigm" that has attained a certain prominence in Anglo-American film theory. Mullarkey's place in the controversy is between cognitivists like Bordwell and the "grand theory" proponents of "subject positions" and Lacanian psychology whom Bordwell and others have attacked. Mullarkey's critique of cognitivism is that it replaces theory with scientism, empiricism and biologism. He emphasizes Bordwell's clear distinction between mind and world, according to which the mind is an "inferring machine" that processes information about the world. For Mullarkey this separation is narrow-minded and forecloses any possibility of discussing film as "event."

One major problem that Mullarkey has with Bordwell's approach is its strong normativity. This comes out, for example, in the discussion of syuzhet and fabula, narratological terms that Bordwell "inherits" from Russian formalism (31). For Bordwell, syuzhet refers to the partial and perhaps messy information provided by the narrative style of a film, whereas fabula refers to a mentally reconstructed version of the story in the mind of the viewer. Mullarkey criticizes Bordwell for claiming that one type of storytelling, classical Hollywood narrative, is able to simulate the "natural" way in which the human brain constructs fabulae. Other styles, especially art cinema styles, are considered mere derivations from this norm, attributable to their authors' self-conscious desire to present "ambiguity" or "excess." This seems to short-circuit any positive analysis of art-films as experiences in their own right. Mullarkey argues emphatically that what is termed "excess" would be better understood as "new forms of realism" (35).

Following up on Bordwell with a discussion of Slavoj Žižek's psychoanalytic approach (chapter 3) is a bit of poetic justice given the tendentiousness of the two authors' written exchanges. In total contrast to Bordwell, what Žižek calls the Real is radically unknowable, a void at which we arrive once we have passed through a symbolic and imaginary "itinerary" and die. The symbolic and the imaginary are made of our efforts to overcome our void through the creation of representations that never seem to add up. The inevitable dissonances in representations are "signs of the Real" (66). All-knowing science and other generalized explanations are attempts to explain away these signs, "objets a," or "bits" of the real. Such explanations, however, are only a big Other trying to fill the void with a totalizing "construction of substitute realities" (67). The history of culture is composed of substitutes, through which we do manage to know ourselves (as void) and our anxieties; they give us "contours" of the Real through a "traversing of [Freudian] fantasy."

Mullarkey criticizes Žižek on empirical terms. (Perhaps Freud was wrong about oedipal fantasies. What does this imply for Žižek?) However, the criticism that informs Mullarkey's position involves representation. Because Žižek defines human nature as ego-development, he describes film as a representation (as knowledge of the void through fantasy), indeed just as much as Bordwell does (as information to process). Mullarkey's conception of humans as "not any sort of thing at all, but a relational process," or "forms of material becoming," aims to free him from the representation axiom (76, 84).

Mullarkey then gives a very strong account of Gilles Deleuze's two cinema books (chapter 4). For Deleuze, images impinge directly on our senses. Since the philosopher's work is to create concepts "adequate for each object of enquiry," Deleuze's objective is to mould his thought to this affective impingement -- in other words, to "the contours of cinematic practice" (83). Mullarkey gives a lucid account of important parts of Deleuze's taxonomy of film images, the invention of which might be thought of as the way in which film "thinks" through the work it makes philosophy do.

Deleuze's books, as dense as they are, have a narrative arc going from the movement-image to the time-image. Mullarkey puts it like this:

there was once a cinematic image adequate for expression (movements that mattered), that then fell into crisis (the shattering of the movement-image), before its resurrection as a time-image, an image adequate for its time, even when it is a time of loss and decay (87).

By the end of WWII Deleuze believed that movement-image cinema had exhausted its possibilities and became a cliché. It was at this historical moment that the time-image -- images in which action is subjected to time -- "awakened" us from these clichés to show time anew, as change and becoming. Where Bordwell sees derivation from Hollywood norms, Deleuze sees redemption and the discovery of real events beyond too-rigid "thresholds" built up in the cliché. Though sympathetic to Deleuze's project, Mullarkey takes him to task on some misreadings of Bergson, which I don't have the space to go into here. Deleuze's most essential division -- between movement-images and time-images -- would not have been recognized by Bergson. Yet Deleuze shows his preferences for just one type, the cinema of the time-image, and unjustifiably betrays his prejudices, erecting his own rigid binary that forms a new threshold, no longer letting films think for themselves.

With Stanley Cavell, Mullarkey addresses the legacy of the indexical tradition of André Bazin and Siegfried Kracauer. This tradition has defended a privileged relation between film and the world, one in which the mechanical reproduction of light implies an ontological connection between things and film images of them (chapter 5). Cavell evokes Heidegger to argue that things we see in the film participate "in their own coming to filmic presence" (115). Things in films are both real and unreal, present and absent, giving the cinema a dose of magic, or what Mullarkey terms "ontological enchantment." Enchanted objects shown on screen attain a degree of reflexivity; they are about themselves. Their presence is combined with a Wittgensteinian concern for "other minds" and ordinary language. Cavell terms, somewhat metaphorically, the manner in which objects appear the "mind" of the film (122). Cavell settles on the term "mind" because when we become aware of the presence of things we feel compelled to acknowledge the film's world in the same way tht we acknowledge the minds of others. Mullarkey rounds out the chapter with Alain Badiou's short article on film, in which Badiou claims that film has an "inessential essence" as +1 of all the other arts. Badiou feeds Mullarkey's contention that "film can only do rather than be" (131).

To see film as a combination of processes, it is important to resist the temptation to divide mind and world (chapter 6). Joseph Anderson almost gets this right when he bases his cognitivist approach on J. J. Gibson's "ecology of mind." Gibson thought that perception is not a complete view of things, but that it takes place through affordances and selections of elements of the environment according to present needs. An affordance can be thought of as an instance of "world-and-self-in-relation" (135). Theories of film also can be likened to affordances. Edward Branigan, for example, has described the language games that theorists and critics use to build an "image schema" of the cinema. Through these metaphors theorists show the particular affordance of the cinema that they have been able to access. However, most of them, as Branigan notes, mistake a small fact about the cinema for an explanation, seeing the affordance as a complete account. Mullarkey recommends Rick Altman's geometrical representation of cinema events as a better picture of, at least, the complexity of processes involved (142).

For Mullarkey, Gibson "has reinvented" Bergson's theory of perception, also based on selection, which holds that the "brain is in the world" (or in the screen) (135). A theory of ever-changing and multiple film events underpins the rest of Mullarkey's argument (chapters 7-9). Events do not happen to, but "through someone" (144). Under normal circumstances we operate within contexts, views, or Deleuzian "thresholds." The whole is immobilized. Film, however, can give us a qualitatively different experience by reconnecting us to Bergsonian duration (and its qualitative difference) that lies beyond our thresholds, mainly by speeding us up or slowing us down. Mullarkey is (in ways, reminiscent of Jacques Rancière) interested in the discordant elements of all films (161). Film continually creates disturbances from which the new arises, "out of context" (169). By way of examples, Mullarkey has a thing for coffee. Not coffee that gets us through the day, but film scenes of pouring coffee, of waiting for it to be ground, or watching it stirred. These moments remind him of Bergson's writings on the patience necessary for sugar to melt. Time at such moments is lived affectively, in the frustration demanded of us. The relation between self, the coffee, and time, is a newly imposed part of the multiplicity which I had previously immobilized.

For Mullarkey, felt time sets off the Bergsonian process of "fabulation" which he calls "the basis of fiction-making through which processes come alive for us as Events" (174). Fabulation (foreshadowed by Cavell's enchantment) is a part of the primitive mind by which humans cope with the realization of death by distinguishing between the animate and the inanimate. It has an anthropomorphic tendency, it assigns intentions, vitalizes nature, turning a spring (a "datum provided directly by the senses") into a spirit. It is also how bodies become persons, and Bergson, in Mullarkey's words, has his own kind of "mirror stage" -- not in the name of ego development as for Lacan, but in the name of survival over time (177). Moments of shock and trauma are especially rich in fabulation as people often respond to them by giving them intentionality, so that they themselves can have some impact on them. Fabulated events "have a face" for us (178).

As a mixture of self and world, fabulation offers a cogent response to the "paradox of fiction," the seemingly irrational way in which works of fiction, and especially film fiction, can make us feel real emotions. No longer processed as a representation of the world, a film has a spirit that influences our self-image and is influenced by it: film and self come to be in a shared event. Mullarkey illustrates the power of this "reactualized present" with a brilliant reading of Titanic (184). Even though the film recounts an event whose outcome has been historically determined, it succeeds at bringing most viewers into the event's present tense, making them hope against destiny that the ship will miss the iceberg and the lovers will come together.

Refraction of Reality concludes with a discussion of the implications of Mullarkey's view of cinema for thinking (chapter 9). If perception is refraction then theories are incomplete. Through selection, however, we have the illusion of knowing; the theories of others are mere refractions whereas mine explains it all. Bergson calls this partial blindness "incomplete relativity." Mullarkey espouses a "complete relativity" that brings him close to François Laruelle's "non-philosophy." If I consider perception from the outside, I realize that my view must also be refraction. The whole is intimated at moments of disturbance when I am forced to acknowledge what lies outside my thresholds. For Mullarkey, one can say that film thinks if thinking means "whatever undoes any simple, extant definition" (210). Or more positively:

our inability to exclude any locus for thinking is predicated on the openness of thinking from our point of view, an openness that sees the multiplicity of definitions of thinking together as an increasingly detailed group of contours. (210)

Mullarkey ends by concluding that "cinema thinks, but in a non-philosophical way" (215).

My questions regarding Mullarkey's book concern this relativism. Though I generally agree with its open spirit, I have a few doubts. First, I don't think this is going to sufficiently assuage the anxieties that it so perceptively diagnoses, or certainly not all of them. A dyed-in-the-wool Bordwellian, for example, when confronted with what she considers to be rampant theorizing on one hand and "pluri-knowing" on the other, is likely to stick to the rich but limited province of cognitivism. Secondly, it is not clear to me that "undoing thought" is thinking in more than a metaphorical way. Film viewing is wrapped up in my thresholds, and the only way to get out of these is through affect and intuition (a Bergsonian concept underrepresented here). We seem to move away from thinking toward feeling and emotion, as if the film event does not have a mind at all, but a heart. This is not unsatisfactory to me, but it leaves the term film "mind" (and some related terms, admittedly not invented by Mullarkey) somewhat bloated and overly impressionistic.

These hesitations aside, Refractions of Reality is an original and valuable contribution to the field of film philosophy. It is original in that it gives an account of film that is open to many theories, some diametrically opposed, without choosing any single one. It is perhaps most valuable in its highly successful dislocation of the rigid, myopic perspective of so many contemporary theories -- many of which start with an observation about film that is then inflated into something resembling the bad, static "religion" criticized by Bergson when he discusses fabulation in The Two Sources of Morality and Religion.