Reframing the Intercultural Dialogue on Human Rights: A Philosophical Approach

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Jeffrey Flynn, Reframing the Intercultural Dialogue on Human Rights: A Philosophical Approach, Routledge, 2014, 223pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415706025.

Reviewed by Stephen C. Angle, Wesleyan University


Human rights are brandished, criticized, and debated on streets and in seminars the world over. To some, human rights promise a firm foundation for healthy and equitable societies; to others, they imperil age-old values at the cores of people's identities. To give just one example, Malaysia's prime minister recently worried about "human rightism," which he characterized as a new religion that posed a major threat to the Islamic faith (Malay Mail Online, May 14, 2014). Jeffrey Flynn's important new book is aimed at the central issues raised as actors around the globe grapple with the apparent tension between the universal aspirations of human rights and our manifest differences. Although Flynn's starting point is an actual dialogue about human rights that took place among philosophers in 1947, his conception of intercultural dialogue is in fact much broader. It explicitly includes the voices of activists and others struggling on the margins of their societies, sometimes against dominant interpretations of their cultures. Flynn both synthesizes and revises Habermas's various writings about human rights, arguing that the resulting version of discourse theory is the most promising way to frame intercultural human rights dialogue. On the basis of Flynn's attention to themes like multicultural modernity, symmetrical dialogue, and the perils of overly "secularistic" worldviews, I endorse Flynn's approach as extremely promising, though I wonder if it is possible (and desirable) to "decenter the West" even more thoroughly than Flynn has done.

The book is divided into two parts, "Multiple Foundations for Human Rights" and "A Dialogical Framework." In the first part, Flynn sets out his agenda and then engages critically with two influential alternatives to Habermas's approach, Rawls's "Law of Peoples" and Charles Taylor's "unforced consensus." A central theme of these chapters is the need to balance an openness to genuinely learning from others with sufficient conceptual determinacy. A second strand of the argument notes that the legacy of colonialism combined with the current enormous global inequalities of wealth pose major challenges to any symmetrical dialogue; throughout the book, Flynn looks for ways to overcome these obstacles.

Another important contribution Flynn makes is to thematize the dynamic nature of normative traditions and their political contexts. For example, he emphasizes that Christianity has been far from monolithic or static with respect to human rights, with widespread condemnation of "the rights of man" in the nineteenth century giving way to a more supportive stance by the middle of the twentieth. In his discussion of Rawls, Flynn identifies a related shortcoming: namely, Rawls's insistence on characterizing relations with others -- even "decent" societies -- in terms of toleration, rather than as potential partners from whom we can learn and whom we can criticize. Among other things, this ignores the fractures within other "peoples" and treats them as static. Flynn's engagement here with Rawls is quite careful and extends to several of Rawls's more recent defenders and friendly critics. Flynn likes Taylor's more dialogical approach, but shows convincingly that, as he puts it, Taylor's "emphasis on cross-cultural understanding can begin to take precedence over the critical function of human rights" (79). Taylor's idea that "reimmersion" in one's culture can bring out new possibilities is important, but without a more contentful understanding of the motivation for and structure of "dialogue," it is hard to be confident that such reimmersions will lead anywhere.

The complementary shortcomings of Rawls and Taylor lead Flynn to Habermas, so in Part II, Flynn articulates and revises Habermas's relevant theorizing. The starting points are well-known -- the co-originality of human rights and popular sovereignty, as private and public autonomy presuppose one another -- but are no less controversial for being much-discussed. Flynn does an admirable job of bringing out precisely how human rights are supposed to be presupposed, and in so doing makes some crucial clarifications. First of all, he suggests that we think of the five categories of human rights (which Habermas argues are presupposed in the idea of legitimate law) as "human rights principles" rather than just groups of rights. This is important because it allows him to respond to one of the standard objections to Habermas's view, namely that Habermas leaves out the moral content of rights. As Flynn explains, the most that the rational reconstruction of constitution-making can show is that certain "core but very abstract elements of the idea of human rights" (i.e., the human rights principles) are "anchored within the practice of constitutional democracy". This grounding of the legitimacy of human rights as a system must then be supplemented by "the actual elaboration of specific rights in particular contexts," which requires specific moral arguments (101).

Flynn then adds a second qualification, in part to answer the objection that the account is still rooted too narrowly in constitutional practice, and so does not account for the force of dissidents using human rights as a language of moral protest. If we refer to the "normative substance" of (specific) human rights as "human rights norms" (104), we can then take either a moral or a legal perspective on these norms. Thus, we can say that a dissident is adopting a moral perspective -- part of the on-going moral discourse of humankind -- while someone advocating for a specific right to be included in a human rights treaty is adopting a legal perspective (104-05). Flynn maintains that this distinction allows him to account for the dissident while still preserving Habermas's critical stance toward those who jump from a moral account of human rights directly to claims about their global legal applicability (which Habermas criticizes as "human rights fundamentalism").

Up to this point, Flynn has done an admirable job of showcasing the strengths of a Habermasian approach to global human rights dialogue, including answering some important objections. In chapter five, "How to Frame a Real Dialogue," he takes on a different kind of challenge. He asks: might the discourse model be rejected as an exclusively Western way of framing the dialogue? Another way to put what I take to be the same point: is it a problem that while Flynn (and Habermas) have shown ample interest in the substantive, normative views of adherents of non-Western traditions, the only theorists whose views have been consulted about how to frame the global dialogue itself are from Europe and America? Even as our theorizing has become more sensitive to global diversity, only rarely have we recognized a greater diversity of theorists. In addition to Habermas and Rawls and Taylor, it would be well to welcome the likes of Mou Zongsan and Zhao Tingyang, Abdolkarim Soroush and Abdullahi Ahmed An-Na'im.[1]

It seems to me that Flynn offers two kinds of response to this challenge -- which, after all, he brings up himself, albeit not in quite the pointed way that I have done. He says that all participants in intercultural dialogue must be willing to accept a distinction between "norms that they think should be accepted by all others" and other aspects of their worldviews and values that "cannot meet such a demanding standard" (126). He sees this distinction as equivalent to that between the right and the good, or perhaps between morality and ethics. In response to Taylor's claim that relying on a right-versus-good distinction is "parochial," Flynn says that although it would indeed be parochial to insist that everyone agree on the theoretical justification for the distinction, he does not need to insist on agreement at that level. If everyone accepts it for his or her own reasons, as a practical guide to seeking agreement, then that is sufficient. Flynn concludes: "What else could it possibly mean to try to get everyone to agree on certain norms with people who have very different worldviews from one's own? And how could an intercultural dialogue on human rights proceed otherwise?" (128) These last two questions mark the first of his responses to the worry that his framing of the dialogue is troublingly Eurocentric, and while they seem to be meant as merely rhetorical questions, they can also be taken as an invitation to explore alternatives. This is especially true in light of Flynn's second potential response, which is his healthy acceptance that his project "must remain open to further dialogical decentering" (167).

A review like this is not the place for sustained exploration of alternative approaches to framing dialogue, but let me gesture toward some possibilities. The idea is not, of course, that the only acceptable theory of dialogue must emerge from universally shared theories of communication or rationality: just as Flynn has drawn on but also criticized Rawls and Taylor, so might one draw on but also criticize non-Western theorists. The contemporary Iranian theorist Abdolkarim Soroush, for example, has much to offer about the evolution of what he calls "religious knowledge," especially in response to modernity and secularism, that is quite congenial to Flynn's project, but it will also partly challenge Flynn's understanding of "modern religions" and the roles that religious knowledge should play in global dialogues (Soroush 2000). The contemporary Chinese theorist Zhao Tingyang has written provocatively about the failures of the international system; his efforts to articulate an alternative (with certain roots in Chinese traditions) are explicitly cross-cultural and dialogic, making him an obvious interlocutor for someone like Flynn. In addition, like Soroush, some of Zhao's writings have been translated into English (Zhao 2009). Mou Zongsan, the most influential modern Confucian philosopher, has also written on human rights and on structural relations between ethical and political norms in ways that could contribute to a dialogue about dialogue. His work is still mostly untranslated, but I have explored relevant aspects of it in a recent book -- and Flynn will be happy to see that, on my reading, the approach to human rights dialogue that Mou would recommend shares key features with Habermas (Angle 2012). How much difference more globally open theorizing about dialogue will make to how we should conceive of dialogue is a question for the future, as we consider new insights and perspectives and weigh new lines of reasoning.

Returning now to Flynn's argument, in chapter six he draws further on Habermas to articulate a relatively open and symmetrical approach to the role of religious traditions in human rights dialogues, based on three key ideas. First, European modernity is not simply a "radical secular break with a medieval religious past" (161). Many intellectual currents associated with modernity had their roots in internal debates of medieval Christianity. This genealogy grounds both the belief that other religious traditions will be internally diverse and subject to change, and that they may well contain valuable, untapped moral intuitions. The second key claim is that all traditions today face challenges posed by the "facts of modernity." Habermas says that all societies must come to terms with:

the individualizing and rationalizing pressure exerted by the market economy and bureaucratic administration on traditional ways of life; the institutionalized legal, economic, and scientific discourses which give rise to fallible profane knowledge; and, not least, the pluralism of worldviews and forms of life that already exist within their own societies as alternatives to the faith and ethos of the majority culture. (165)

For better and for worse, these challenges cannot be avoided, though different societies can meet them in different ways. The resulting picture is one of multiple modernities with limits, or what Habermas calls "multicultural modernity."

The third idea is that while the formal justifications of laws and court decisions in our states must pass through an "institutional filter" that rules out explicitly religious reasons, we should avoid the "secularistic" mistake according to which religious reasoning has no place in the informal public sphere. Partly because of the genealogy of modernity mentioned a moment ago, Habermas's and Flynn's more permissive notion of the secular allows for religion to play an important role, especially insofar as religious arguments can be translated into non-religious terms. Crucially, this is to be via a "cooperative translation project" (153): all citizens, both adherents of a particular religion and those who are not, are to work together to find ways to bring religiously sourced intuitions and reasoning into secular language, and this means that the secular language itself must be open to enrichment or revision. It is on this basis that Flynn maintains this process -- whether applied domestically or, in the case of human rights, globally -- is adequately symmetrical rather than Eurocentric. Or at least, he sees his project as moving in a non-Eurocentric direction; as already mentioned above, he acknowledges the need to remain open to "further dialogical decentering." Flynn argues that he and Habermas have considerable common ground with post-colonial theorists like Dipesh Chakrabarty in that they all "accept the indispensability of certain ostensibly Western ideas while trying to come to terms with and overcome their inadequacies" (170).

In the final chapter, Flynn both outlines Habermas's proposal for a global constitution rather than a global state -- which is meant to enable a "realistic utopia of human rights" -- and then revises Habermas's position. Flynn argues quite convincingly that in a world in which over a third of the population is living in extreme poverty, a global human rights project "can only generate the kind of legitimacy and global solidarity it needs . . . by giving higher priority [than Habermas does] to fulfilling a human right to subsistence" (175). Flynn's summary of Habermas here is crisp and clear. In keeping with his core idea that human rights are co-original with democratic institutions, Habermas "looks for ways in which existing global institutions already embody idealizations" that point toward the norms of a global constitution (176). He maintains that the resulting framework is multi-leveled (supranational, transnational, and national) and multipolar (supranational organizations, transnational regimes, and states). Flynn then argues at some length that Habermas's exclusion of subsistence rights from the human rights enforced at the supranational (i.e., global) level cannot be sustained. Without a modification that will allow Habermas to recognize at least urgent subsistence rights as among our most basic rights, Flynn shows, he undermines the legitimacy of the global constitution. Inattention to global poverty has growing disintegrative and delegitimizing effects on human rights discourse.

Of course, legitimacy is not enough to develop a global constitution; we also need to develop sufficient global solidarity to give its institutions the commitment that they need when conflicts emerge between local loyalties and global human rights. Here again, Flynn moves beyond Habermas, arguing that Habermas's merely reactive notion of solidarity needs to be supplemented with a more active form of global civic solidarity. Flynn focuses on transnational NGOs like Human Rights Watch and Amnesty International: their collective activities can be seen as helping to generate and reinforce a transnational public sphere. I agree that this is a start, but we must be clear that it is only the barest beginning of what is needed. One enormous challenge is that activist human rights organizations often shun the kind of nuanced, multicultural dialogue that Flynn advocates, out of a (often well-founded) fear that subtlety and complexity play into the hands of those who would use obfuscation to justify abuses. It is indeed hopeful, as Flynn notes, that Amnesty International has announced a new focus on social and economic rights, but a great deal of work will be needed at all levels, around the world, before we can more confidently speak of a robust, transnational public sphere.

Jeffrey Flynn's is a model work of political philosophy: careful and clear in its argument, rich in detail, and ambitious in scope. While there are a few relevant Western theorists whom I was surprised were omitted (such as Parekh 1999 on dialogue, or Ackerly 2011 on activists), Flynn is very thorough and charitable toward his interlocutors. Certainly, one cannot find a better critical exposition of Habermas on human rights and global dialogue. I have suggested that there is ample room for extending the conversation over proper meta-theory to include a range of non-Western voices, and everything that I have seen in the book suggests that Flynn will find this idea congenial. Let me end, though, with a caution. "Dialogue" is not just about disembodied voices in conversation: it depends on the practices of people with social and institutional locations. One challenge to broadening the range of "theorists" with whom we discuss the meaning of dialogue is that the social and institutional identities of these theorists -- and the ways that they understand and practice theory -- may not always fit comfortably into the seminar rooms of professional academics and UN diplomats. To whatever extent we find this to be so, we must be open to learning that the sort of dialogue that will ultimately lead to global legitimacy and solidarity may need to leave the seminar room behind.


Ackerly, Brooke. "Human Rights Enjoyment in Theory and Activism." Human Rights Review 12:2 (2011): 221-239.

Angle, Stephen C. Contemporary Confucian Political Philosophy: Toward Progressive Confucianism. Cambridge, UK: Polity Press, 2012.

Malay Mail Online, "PM says 'human rightism, humanism, secularism' new religion threatening Islam" (May 14, 2014).

Mou, Zongsan. Zhengdao yu zhidao [Authority and Governance]. Taipei: Xuesheng Shuju, 1991.

Parekh, Bhikhu. "Non-Ethnocentric Universalism." In Human Rights in Global Politics, eds. Tim Dunne and Nicholas J. Wheeler. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press: 1999, 128-159.

Soroush, Abdolkarim. Mahmoud Sadri and Ahmad Sadri, eds. and trans. Reason, Freedom, and Democracy in Islam: Essential Writings of Abdolkarim Soroush. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.

Zhao, Tingyang. "A Political World Philosophy in terms of All-under-heaven (Tian-xia)." Diogenes 221 (2009): 5-18.

[1] See Mou 1991; Zhao 2009; and the discussion of both in Angle 2012. See also Soroush 2000. While Flynn does discuss the Islamic thinkers Abdullahi An-na’im and Khaled Abou El Fadl, he cites them as evidence that it may be possible to find interpretations of Islam that are compatible with human rights, not as theorists of global dialogue in their own right (see 21-23).