Refugees and the Ethics of Forced Displacement

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Serena Parekh, Refugees and the Ethics of Forced Displacement, Routledge, 2017, 296pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415712613.

Reviewed by Michael Blake, University of Washington


Serena Parekh's book begins with some startling facts. 65.3 million people in our world live outside the state system, displaced from their countries of origin yet not legally resettled into a country of refuge. Of this group, only one percent will eventually be resettled into a new country of refuge. The rest will continue to live in a parallel world of temporary solutions; they disappear into large urban centers, or are warehoused in refugee camps. The average duration of stay in these camps, finally, is approximately seventeen years (3). Parekh's cogent volume argues that political philosophers have not adequately come to grips with these facts. Doing so would require us to develop a new form of ethical analysis focused particularly upon these solutions -- an "ethics of the temporary," as Parekh terms it (52).

Parekh's argument begins with the structure of refugee protection -- as it is described in international law, and as it is on the ground. The norms of international law combine relatively rigid rules about non-refoulement -- on which states are not permitted to coercively return migrants to the circumstances in which their lives are at risk -- with relatively weak norms about refugee protection and resettlement. Wealthy states are keen to avoid the stigma of breaking the norms of non-refoulement, but equally keen to avoid allowing a great many people to resettle permanently within their borders. The result is that the wealthier states tend to employ a two-fold response to the problems of refugee protection, emphasizing deterrence against those seeking to move -- through interdiction at sea, carrier sanctions, and so on -- and the use of camps in less wealthy states to warehouse those who have fled violence and persecution. The rhetoric of security, moreover, has come to dominate our discussions of migration, and has become a way of justifying a broad antipathy to opening borders to needy outsiders. This situation, argues Parekh, ought to be the particular focus on those who write about the morality of migration in our current world.

Those who have written about refugees, moreover, ought to keep these structural factors in mind. Those who have tended to minimize responsibility for refugees -- including Michael Walzer, David Miller, and Christopher Heath Wellman -- ignore the particular ways in which the present world harms those fleeing persecution. Although these figures do discuss encampment in passing -- Miller, for instance, notes that it should not become a durable solution by default (58) -- the specific harms done by encampment escape their notice. Much the same, however, could be said about those who are more sympathetic to the plight of refugees, including Matthew Gibney, Seyla Benhabib, and Joseph Carens. They fail to acknowledge the distinctive harm done by our current practices of encampment, and so fail to offer robust replies to such practices; Parekh argues that Benhabib's principle of communicative freedom, for example, may support "precisely the thinking that has led to the current status quo" about encampment (68).

Parkeh's most significant contribution, I believe, is to offer a powerful phenomenological account of just what that harm would be. Relying on Giorgio Agamben's concept of "bare life" -- on which we do a particular sort of violence to people by removing them from the shared world of reasons and plans, and reduce them to the category of the merely biological -- she offers an account of how the phenomenon of encampment degrades those who experience it. The encamped are cut off in spatial terms from the rest of the world; they are cut off socially, as well, in that their world is effectively reduced to the camp's boundaries, with minimal rights to participate in social or economic activity outside. The encamped, moreover, are cut off from the possibility of communicative action generally; Parekh details how the presumption that the migrant will lie tends towards a blanket refusal to take that migrant's complaints, or words, as reasons for action. The refugee, in the camp, is taken not as a person who might surprise us with her words and her work, but as a mere biological fact. This, she argues, is an ontological deprivation, and it is at the root of the problem with encampment.

The result is that we ought to have a new global conversation about the legitimate global response to the displaced. We ought to develop a new vision of remedial responsibility for the structural problem that gave rise to encampment, and a new set of policy solutions that avoid such ontological deprivations. Parekh is keen to avoid particular policy prescriptions; her aim is to describe the problem, rather than to detail how it could be solved. She does, however, offer several possible responses, including replacing encampment with temporary integration into host societies, and the linking of foreign aid with human rights standards within those camps that remain (138-146).

Parekh's book is a welcome one, for reasons both of philosophy and of politics. It is well-reasoned and philosophically rigorous; it is also timely, and a significant step forward for our collective reasoning about the morality of refugee and asylum policy. It is, moreover, an exceptionally learned book, combining serious discussion of analytic philosophy, continental philosophy, and the empirical realities of global politics. I would also argue that its focus on the phenomenology of encampment is a virtue; political philosophers often write as if we were advisors to global leaders, arguing for particular sorts of policy innovation. Parkeh's vision is a welcome alternative; it focuses on precisely how encampment in particular is wrong, and argues effectively that we ought to take these wrongs seriously prior to any discussion of policy.

I am, however, still somewhat unsure about how to understand her key claim, that we need an ethics of the temporary. I think there are at least two readings of this phrase: on the first, we ought to engage in ethical examination of whether any temporary solution is a legitimate one; and, on the second, we assume that some temporary solution is a necessity, and ask what sorts of solution would be the least awful. On the former reading, though, it does not seem quite right to say that the philosophers Parekh discusses have not given us an ethics of the temporary; many of them have, as she notes, specifically discussed encampment, if only to condemn it. Parekh's contribution, then, is to offer a particular vision of why these thinkers are right to offer that condemnation -- which is a significant achievement, but not a total break with what has gone before. I think the latter reading is more true to Parekh's intentions; but I worry that, here, we might have legitimate questions about whether any temporary solution would successfully avoid the problems she describes.

In a fascinating suggestion from the introduction -- which is not followed up in the later parts of the book -- Parekh suggest that a refugee camp should have at least as much political legitimacy as a Rawlsian decent consultation hierarchy (2). This is a powerful idea, but I am not sure it is defensible. Rawls's analysis of a decent consultation hierarchy, after all, entails that the society in question has a right to be free from interference, so that something like a permanent existence for that society is a central value for international society. Could we really imagine that a refugee camp might come to have a similar value? Refugee camps -- for Parekh -- do not seem to be that sort of thing, and their eventual non-existence would hardly seem to constitute a loss to the world. More broadly, though, I am unsure about the extent to which this reading of Parekh's "ethics of the temporary" constitutes a sort of acquiescence to the perpetuation of evil. Are we right to accept the phenomenon of encampment, and seek to make these camps less damaging, or does this phenomenon simply look like the insistence that murders must be done in a more kindly manner? These questions are complex ones, and it is not to Parekh's discredit that her book does not directly engage with them; nonetheless, I think my reaction to her views may ultimately depend upon how such questions are to be answered.

Parekh's analysis of the phenomenology of displacement, moreover, seems at least potentially subject to challenge. Most of those facing displacement, she notes, do not go into camps; a majority "disappear into crowded urban centers" (90). The analysis she provides, however, focuses on the experience of the encamped, and how the camp reduces the life of the encamped to bare biology. Living in a city, though, might not involve such a reduction; being undocumented, for instance, may be unpleasant, but does it involve the sorts of ontological deprivation she describes here? I am, more generally, rather unclear about the borders of the concept of bare life -- although, I should note, this is a problem as much with my understanding of Agamben as it is with Parekh's use of this concept. On one reading of this concept, even federal income taxation is presumptively wrongful, since the Internal Revenue Service cares little for my specificity as it processes my return. (The IRS, after all, cares only about me in my quantitative aspect, rather than about my human self.) The concept, then, might stand in need of some unpacking, so that results like this are ruled out.

This, however, might require Parekh to provide more detail on what a solution might be that did not involve this sort of reduction. I worry that, on one reading, it is the mere fact of a temporary and tenuous existence that is at the heart of our deprivation -- on which the undocumented do face an ontological deprivation, but so too might those provided with what Parekh defends: a temporary integration into a host society. If, in contrast, it is not temporariness but lack of voice that is at the heart of this concept, then perhaps we might have a refugee camp with sufficient participatory rights to justify its existence as a legitimate response to displacement -- not merely as a less grave evil than what is currently found, but as a genuinely rightful sort of society. These questions, though, might require some greater analysis of how Agamben's concepts might be understood, so as to understand the moral nature of the improvements Parekh recommends.

These worries, though, are best understood as a request for a further conversation. The topic of Parekh's volume is a crucial one, and her response to that topic is insightful and powerful; I both hope and expect that further conversations about these issues will take her ideas seriously.