Relations and Predicates

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Herbert Hochberg and Kevin Mulligan (eds.), Relations and Predicates, Ontos Verlag, 2004, 256pp, €74,00/$79.95 (hbk), ISBN 393720251X.

Reviewed by Achille C. Varzi, Columbia University


This book is presumably a collection of essays delivered at a conference, though it's hard to say. There is no cover description and the editors' introduction, where this information might have been found, is missing from the volume (at least from my copy) in spite of being listed in the table of contents. A curious editorial slip. In fact, from an editorial perspective this book is a disaster. Not only is the format reminiscent of those camera-ready volumes that jammed our libraries in the late Eighties, when word processors began to spread and people started using them to produce entire books without knowing how to handle line spacing and hyphenation -- not to mention orphans and widows, footnotes, tabs, apostrophes, etc. There are also lots of typos, English infelicities, punctuation disorders. Obviously nobody checked the page proofs. There are even formulas that were not properly converted from the original files and have been printed with the infamous boxes in place of the logical symbols. Publishing academic books in analytic philosophy is becoming increasingly difficult and not every publisher can afford serious copy-editing. But charging 74 euros for such a poorly manufactured item is appalling.

Anyway, for what it's worth, my reasons for thinking that the volume stems from a conference lie primarily in the unevenness and heterogeneity of the ten essays that compose it, both in content and in quality. As the title suggests, Relations and Predicates deals mainly with the problem of universals, with special reference to the issues raised by relational predication. Some of the essays explore aspects of the history of these issues while others take up a number of questions that feature prominently in the current debate, such as the prospects of trope theory, Bradley's regress, or the problem of order in relational facts. The volume, however, also includes essays that are only marginally connected to these central issues (such as the transitivity of the part-whole relation) or completely off the point (the seeming paradoxicality of certain contingent analytic falsehoods, such as 'I am not here'), so the overall collection is somewhat incohesive. As to quality, the heterogeneity is even more noticeable. There are some good contributions -- and we'll come to those in a moment; but there are also essays that deserve no place in a respectable collection. The opening piece, Lars Gustafsson's 'Absurd Claims' (11-16), is especially striking. Apart from being off the point, the analysis of 'I am not here' that it offers is both amateurish and deeply flawed. It is amateurish in its complete lack of awareness of the extensive literature devoted to this topic, as if Hintikka's 1962 essay on the Cogito were the only relevant contribution. And it is flawed in its resting on false analogies and logical mistakes. Surely we can learn little about 'I am not here' by comparing it with 'There is nothing such as red in the world', and surely the negation of 'There is nothing such as red in the world' is not 'There is something red' (13). Gustafsson also thinks that if 'There is nothing red whatsoever' were true, it would be meaningless because "the word 'red' would lack all sense" (14). And he concludes that the problem boils down to this: that "everyday languages make possible formations of strings which if certain facts were the case could not simply be expressed in these languages" (16). No serious referee would have given thumbs up.

But let me go through the rest of the volume with some order. Of the nine essays that come after Gustafsson's, three concern trope theory. The most extensive discussion is to be found in Herbert Hochberg's 'Relations, Properties, and Particulars' (17-53). Hochberg is no friend of tropes, and his essay raises a number of deep and challenging questions -- for example concerning the assumption that tropes are simple, or that tropes that are exactly similar cannot be compresent. On the other hand, the essay is written mainly as a response to Anna-Sofia Maurin's book If Tropes (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 2002), so it's hard to follow Hochberg's arguments without being acquainted with that book. Indeed, those who are familiar with it may find some of Hochberg's criticisms unfair. He reads Maurin as "defending a tropist account of predication" (18), but that is not quite right. As its title implies, If Tropes offers a conditional investigation into trope theory; it aims to articulate a good theory of tropes under its own assumptions, not to build a case for the theory or to defend it against its rivals. So Hochberg is perfectly justified when he complains that, say, Maurin's account of truth-making leaves something to be desired. But his attacks on other basic issues, such as the trope-theoretic distinction between the so-called A-question (What makes it true that a is F?) and the B-question (What makes it true that a and b are the same F?), betray a misinterpretation of Maurin's project and should be assessed independently.

One of the basic challenges that Hochberg raises in his essay concerns the possibility of providing a tropist account of relations ("for relations are absurd candidates for location in space and time -- just consider temporal and spatial relations themselves", 41). This challenge is explicitly taken up by Käthe Trettin in her contribution, 'Tropes and Relations' (203-218). Trettin considers and rejects the idea (pioneered by John Bacon) that one can simply construe relations as polyadic tropes, and she argues that once property instances are admitted, no relational tropes are really needed. If a has a mass of 2 kg and b a mass of 1 kg, then a and b will be differ at least in their respective tropes of mass and heaviness. But then no particular heavier-than relation is required in order to ground the truth of 'a is heavier than b': "The whole work is done by the respective relata" (205). This leads Trettin to endorse the thesis that relations are internal, or formal, and do not call for a category sui generis -- a thesis that would also dispose of Russell's famous regress argument. The trouble, of course, is that everything depends on what it is for a relation to be internal in the intended sense. Internal relations, Trettin says, are "cases of existential or ontological dependence" (207). But this means that (i) we seem to be stuck with at least one universal relation, and (ii) we need a good account of what that relation, or its trope-theoretic construal, is. Trettin deals with both worries at once by defining the relevant notion as follows: a is ontologically dependent on b iff it is impossible that a exists and b does not exist. This is the right strategy, I think. But there are well known objections to this definition (for example: if there are necessary existents, everything would depend on them), so more work needs to be done.

In her essay, Trettin also considers (and rejects) the particularist account put forward by Donald Mertz in a number of recent works. Mertz's account is not strictly trope-theoretic, since he believes that tropes are unable to account for any genuine complexity in the world. It is, however, an account that would meet the challenge raised by Hochberg and other universal realists insofar as it is based on an ontology of relation instances, or "unit attributes", of which monadic tropes can be seen as a limit case. Mertz's own contribution to the volume, 'Objects as Hierarchical Structures: A Comprehensive Ontology' (113-148), offers an articulate formulation of precisely this view. This is an ambitious and demanding essay and even a rough compendium would take us too far afield. Let me just point out that Mertz's goal is not only to show how one can provide a particularist account of "same-level", atomic relational structures; it is also to show how one can account for the sort of "hierarchical" molecular networks that emerge at increasing levels of complexity (consciousness, for instance). To this end, Mertz puts forward a number of principles of "horizontal" and "vertical" composition, which in turn yield corresponding principles of identity and indiscernibility whose theoretical import is illustrated in connection with some traditional philosophical tribulations. His account of the problem of persistence through time is particularly illuminating in this regard, though it is a pity that he does not try to establish any link with similar accounts familiar from the literature -- such as those afforded by four-dimensional ontologies or by Chisholm's theory of entia successiva.

So much for trope theory and its variants. Relations do not only pose problems for the enemy of universals; even the universal realist has to face serious difficulties, and two such difficulties are addressed explicitly in the essays by Benjamin Schnieder, 'Once More: Bradleyan Regresses' (219-256), and Erwin Tegtmeier, 'The Ontological Problem of Order' (149-160). Schnieder's is in my view the best piece in the whole collection. It is not just on Bradley's original formulation of the regress argument; it considers four different versions, and in each case Schnieder offers convincing reasons for breathing "a deep sigh of relief". The first two versions are easily dismissed. On the first, the problem seems to be that if a is R-related to b, we must make room for R but also for the relations between a and R and between R and b, and for the relations among these four entities, and so on ad infinitum. But so what? -- says Schnieder. Nobody should be irritated by such a "regress" just because of the numberless multitude of relations involved, just as nobody should be irritated by the fact that the existence of a number entails the existence of an infinity of successors. Similar considerations apply to a second version of the argument, according to which relations do not provide us with the necessitators needed to ground the truth of relational statements. That's true, says Schnieder, but unsurprising. Construed as universals, relations are surely not the right kind of thing to necessitate specific relational statements. And if we look at their particular instances, then we may end up with an infinity of necessitators, but that is once again not a sign that we went wrong. (Well, perhaps Schnieder is a bit quick here. Perhaps an endless network of necessitators is inadequate as a truth-maker, so it would have been nice to see this worry dismissed less rhetorically.) The paper gets especially interesting when it comes to the last two versions of the regress argument. One of these, due to Roger Teichmann, concerns the logical form of elementary predications: (1) If 'a is F' is about F-ness, then its logical form is more perspicuously shown by 'a has F-ness'; but (2) If 'a has F-ness' is about a property, it is about the property of having F-ness; hence (3) If 'a is F' is about F-ness, then its logical form is more perspicuously shown by 'a has the property of having F-ness', which in turn is more perspicuously shown by 'a has the property of having the property of having F-ness' -- and so on. Here the bottom line is that we seem to end up imputing an infinitely complex logical form to elementary predications, and that is something to worry about. Schnieder's main response to this argument concerns (3). He argues that 'F-ness', 'the property of having F-ness', etc. are all co-referential, so there is no reason to think that we get an increase in perspicuity as we move up in the list. And if we do not get an increase in perspicuity, we have no regress: we just have many different ways of saying the same thing. (Schnieder also objects to (1), on the grounds that 'a is F' and 'a has F-ness' are not synonymous, but I leave the details to the reader.) Finally, Schnieder considers a version of the argument put forward by Richard Gaskin, according to which the trouble in 'a is F' comes from the copula. If 'is' stands for the relation of instantiation, we obviously have a regress. But Schnieder objects to this semantic analysis of the copula, and if his reasons are found compelling the regress does not get off the ground.

Tegtmeier's essay is, in my view, less rewarding. It deals specifically with "the problem of order" in relational facts, which is implicit in the second Bradleyan argument mentioned above. Say a is earlier than b. We have two events and a binary relation; what else do we need to account for the fact that the relation holds between those events in one direction but not in the other? According to Tegtmeier, this question raises an ontological problem that was not discovered before Russell, who paid attention to it only temporarily in his 1913 manuscript Theory of Knowledge; and since Russell's manuscript was only published posthumously in 1984, "Gustav Bergmann had to rediscover it [the problem] and independently the present writer" (149). I am not sure this is historically accurate, but never mind that. Tegtmeier finds good reasons to reject both Russell's and Bergmann's solutions: Russell's appeal to the "relational positions" of the relata is on closer inspection a return to the property view of relations that he meant to overcome, while Bergmann's appeal to "ontologized diversities" just cries for an explanation. Unfortunately, Tegtmeier's own solution is hardly more convincing. For Tegtmeier, a relational fact does not merely involve a relation and its relata; it also involves special secondary forms called "ordinators", of which there are exactly four: firstness, secondness, thirdness, and fourthness. (Tegtmeier believes that there are no underived relations with more than four places). Such forms are not strictly speaking constituents of facts, since "a thing together with its form is the thing and nothing else" (156). Yet they do make all the difference. For if a is earlier than b, then a has the form of firstness and b has the form of secondness, whereas if b is earlier than a, then the forms are switched. Now, this sounds completely ad hoc and Tegtmeier is perfectly aware of the problem. Yet he says very little in response. He gives good reasons for not treating ordinators as particulars, properties, or relations. But treating them as mere secondary forms sounds like a mere redescription of the problem to be solved, and one can hardly leave it at that and conclude that "order is basic and neither eliminable nor reducible" (159).

The remaining papers in the volume deal with miscellaneous issues. Ignacio Angelelli's 'Predication Theory: Classical vs. Modern' (55-80) is mostly historical, arguing that three main features differentiate the modern, Fregean theory of predication from the classical theories prevailing until the 19th century: a sharp distinction between predication proper (a is F) and subordination (all Gs are F); a better understanding of the distinction between predication and identity; and the view that quantificational phrases are not denoting phrases. Angelelli offers an evaluation of the conflict between these two traditions and concludes that the Fregean revolution is, at least with regard to the first two features, "a clarification that would probably be welcomed by the classical authors themselves" (55).

Fred Wilson's 'Bareness, as in '"Bare" Particulars': Its Ubiquity' (81-111) is a defense of bare particulars against the objection that they are "horrid" and epistemologically suspect entities. Wilson's main point is that such entities are perfectly compatible with an empiricist ontology, for all basic entities licensed by the Principle of Acquaintance -- including properties -- must be bare. This is an interesting line. On closer inspection, however, it rests on an obscure characterization of some key terms. For example, for Wilson a thing, construed as a bundle of properties, is a fact. Indeed, since a thing also includes among its constituents the "extensity" or area upon which those properties "perch", a thing is a "particular fact" (85). What a fact is, however, is left undefined, and it is of little help to be told that such facts as things must be particulars insofar as the areas they involve are particulars, for by parity of reasoning it would follow that such facts must be universals insofar as properties are universals.

Finally, the essays by Christian Kanzian, 'Warum es die Früher-Später Beziehung nicht gibt' (183-201), and Ingvar Johansson, 'On the Transitivity of the Parthood Relations' (161-181), deal with questions concerning specific relations: Kanzian offers novel arguments against the reality of earlier-later, which he regards as a necessary step towards defending a presentist metaphysics, whereas Johansson takes issue with the view -- characteristic of classical mereology -- that the part-whole relation is always transitive. Both essays are only marginally related to the rest of the volume, so their examination would take us too far. But one point about Johansson's is worth making, since the literature on the topic is utterly confused. Consider a typical "counterexample" to transitivity: the handle is part of the door and the door is part of the house, but the handle is not part of the house. Standardly, cases such as this are explained away by pointing out that they involve a "narrow" understanding of 'part'. Surely the handle is not a functional part of the house (though it is a functional part of the door, and the door of the house), and surely functional parthood (or Φ-parthood, for various narrowing conditions Φ) need not be transitive. But this is not to say that parthood simpliciter is non-transitive: broadly speaking, the handle is part of the house. I always thought this standard account is perfectly reasonable, but Johansson disagrees. He objects that the account gives rise to an odd subsumption relation: how can a more specific concept (Φ-parthood) fail to inherit the properties of the more general one (parthood)? Now, I agree with the general subsumption principle that Johansson is assuming here. But surely the standard account does not imply that Φ-parthood is subsumed under parthood in the relevant sense; it just says that it is narrower than, i.e., included in parthood. And clearly the inheritance principle does not generally hold for inclusion. (After all, the transitive closure of any non-transitive relation is transitive.) So I think the objection misfires. On the other hand, I do agree that more should be said about the sort of "narrowing" that is at issue in the putative counterexamples, and here Johansson makes a good point. He says this: when we assert e.g. that a handle, x, is a functional part of a door, y, we mean to assert two things, namely, that x is part of y and that there is a z (the door's panel) such that x makes something happen to z that is relevant for x's function in relation to y (such as opening and closing y). Modulo minor details, this strikes me as right on target. It should dispel once and for all the confusion surrounding the transitivity axiom of mereology -- but as a clarification of the standard account, not an alternative. (Unfortunately, Johansson goes on to say something that may add to the confusion. He says that the analysis just offered shows that functional parthood and the like are relative products (173), and that is incorrect. The analysis merely shows that such relations are conjunctive. He also says that relative products involve "at least three relata … not just two, as in the parthood relation of mereology" (170). Again, that is incorrect. The definiens of a relative product involves three variables: xR/Sy iff z(xRz & zSy). But the third variable is bound, so we end up with a relation of the same arity as R and S.)

I began this review on a sour note. Let me end by saying that in spite of the heterogeneity and unevenness of the ten essays that it collects, the volume as a whole has more than enough good things to offer. With some editorial supervision, a solid introduction, and perhaps a contribution by the second editor -- whose work on formal relations has helped shape the current debate on many a topic touched on by these essays -- Relations and Predicates could have been a very good book.