Relative Justice: Cultural Diversity, Free Will, and Moral Responsibility

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Tamler Sommers, Relative Justice: Cultural Diversity, Free Will, and Moral Responsibility, Princeton University Press, 2012, 230pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691139937.

Reviewed by Zac Cogley, Northern Michigan University


Some philosophers and social scientists have become increasingly worried that selecting research subjects solely from Western, Educated, Industrialized, Rich, and Democratic (WEIRD) societies affects the validity of research that aims to understand general truths about human nature.1 That worry comes to philosophy via the concern that common intuitions about philosophical thought experiments might be similarly WEIRD.2 In his engaging and thought-provoking book, Relative Justice, Tamler Sommers argues that intuitions about moral responsibility are subject to this bias; he uses this claim to defend a position on the free will debate he terms metaskepticism.

Metaskepticism about moral responsibility is the view that no theory of moral responsibility is objectively correct. It is thus importantly different from realist views about responsibility that supply conditions for moral responsibility that are sometimes satisfied, from first-order skeptical views that hold that no one is ever morally responsible for what they do, as well as from relativist views which hold that different standards for responsibility are correct when suitably culturally specific. (It should be noted that Sommers is not a metaskeptic about morality in general, only moral responsibility.) The book is organized into two natural parts: in the introduction and the first four chapters, Sommers argues in favor of metaskepticism. In the last three chapters, he discusses the ramifications of metaskepticism for our thinking about moral responsibility.

Sommers begins his argument for metaskepticism by noting the central role played by appeals to intuition, people's spontaneous judgments about the truth or falsity of some proposition (11), in developing contemporary theories of moral responsibility. Prominent compatibilists (who believe moral responsibility to be compatible with determinism) and incompatibilists (who do not) all support their views via appeals to intuition, and set out conditions that every person (no matter what culture) must satisfy in order to be morally responsible.

The next stage of Sommers' argument for metaskepticism requires demonstrating that there actually is significant cross-cultural and historical disagreement about moral responsibility. His argument for this claim begins in a chapter focused on differences in intuition between so-called "honor cultures" and "institutionalized cultures" and continues in a chapter discussing intuitional differences between "individualist" and "collectivist" societies. In both chapters, Sommers attends to evidence from anthropology, psychology, sociology, and even classical literature, discussing a fascinating variety of examples, both historical and contemporary.

In his discussion of honor and institutionalized cultures, for example, Sommers draws from contemporary Washington, D.C., Montenegro, Albania, the cultures of Bedouins and Inuits, ancient Greece, medieval Iceland, and nineteenth-century Corsica. He characterizes honor cultures as lacking significant cooperation among strangers, having little or no state protection and scarce resources, and in which people are commonly subject to attempts to steal their property (41). Institutionalized cultures, by contrast, have economies that regularly involve anonymous, cooperative interactions between strangers, significant state enforcement of behavioral norms, more significant resources, and relatively infrequent attempts at stealing (42). He incorporates these observations to argue that the social structure of honor cultures produces very different norms for retribution than exist in institutionalized cultures.

Sommers hypothesizes that the difference in norms governing retribution between institutionalized cultures and honor cultures leads to contrasting beliefs about moral responsibility. Western philosophical accounts of moral responsibility -- produced by theorists who are members of institutionalized cultures -- largely take for granted that being appropriately held morally responsible requires that a person exercises significant control over what she is being held responsible for. They also require that being morally responsible for an action requires that a person intended to perform it or at least negligently brought it about. And Western moral responsibility theorists typically balk at attributing moral responsibility to people who have been manipulated (say, by another agent's implantation of motives in them). Strikingly, Sommers presents evidence that all three of these Western norms on attributions of moral responsibility are lacking in particular honor cultures.

In some honor cultures, for example, killing any member of a murderer's family, group, or clan is appropriate punishment for murder. Thus people are held morally responsible who did not commit the murder. In others, women who are raped are killed simply because they are regarded as having had extramarital sex. So women are held responsible for outcomes they did not intend or control. And in Greek dramas, Agamemnon is held responsible for choices he has made while compelled to do so by the gods and when the gods have manipulated him. All these practices seem to involve attributions of moral responsibility or holding people morally responsible in ways that violate what members of institutionalized cultures regard as the correct norms for attributions of moral responsibility.

Sommers is sensitive to the fact that honor and institutionalized cultures exist along a continuum -- our own, largely institutionalized culture, has elements of honor practices, for example, in retribution for beanballs in baseball -- and that there is variation among individuals within cultures. However, it is still true that cultural differences significantly predict different intuitions on appropriate attributions of moral responsibility. If intuition must be appealed to in defending views of moral responsibility, it appears that divergent perspectives on moral responsibility are inevitable. If this is right, what resources does a universalist have with which to respond?

In perhaps the most important chapter of the book, Sommers considers whether the universalist can explain away the dramatic cultural variation in intuitions about the appropriate assignment of moral responsibility. For the universalist might well accept the existence of the variation Sommers catalogs, but argue in reply that the variation exists due to factors like the influence of problematic biases or cultural authorities acting to preserve their own interests. Perhaps competent judges free from these problematic influences would have intuitions that coalesce in common ways. The universalist can thus argue that the variation in intuitions about moral responsibility might be regarded in a way similar to how disagreements regarding astronomy, evolution, or even the rules of logic are regarded. Mere variation of views does not entail metaskepticism about any of these discourses so long as there is (or could be) general agreement among competent, informed judges who are relatively free of problematic bias.

Sommers responds to this line of argument with a two-stage challenge to the universalist. The universalist's position relies on the assumption that once people agree on non-moral facts and conceptual confusion is eliminated, human beings in any social environment will achieve at least rough consensus about the criteria for appropriate assignments of moral responsibility. Sommers points out first that many of the norms of responsibility attribution he has canvassed have been subjected to internal debate and criticism (90). People regarded as competent judges in Saga Iceland, for example, respond to Sam's torture of Hrafnkels by refusing to prosecute Hrafnkels' revenge killing of Sam's brother. The universalist needs to do more than suppose that further reflection would change minds -- the universalist must say what grounds would lead to changing the minds of the Icelandic judges, not simply suppose that there must be some.

The second stage of Sommers' reply is to argue that recent empirical work on the psychological acquisition and transmission of norms suggests that responsibility norms will inevitably vary with certain variances of social structure (95). If this is correct, then we cannot expect fully rational people who come from different cultures to converge on judgments about moral responsibility. Sommers argues that human beings possess a common psychological architecture that allows for norms to be easily internalized as the result of social influence. Different social influences result from different social and environmental circumstances, so we should expect that norms of moral responsibility attribution would vary with differences in environment. Importantly, Sommers claims that this variation is not only well-entrenched against change but is a rational response to differences in environment. Thus, an appeal to what competent judges would say does the universalist no good, as we should expect competent, rational judges from different environments to have very different views on the norms for proper responsibility attributions.

I think universalists can make better replies than Sommers allows. To do so, they should first appeal to the fact that while Sommers is a metaskeptic about moral responsibility, he is not a metaskeptic or relativist about morality. For example, while he uses the example of honor killings to argue that some cultures do not think control is required for properly holding people morally responsible, he condemns honor killings as wrongful (52). A universalist about moral responsibility can demand of Sommers that when we examine societies for variance in intuition, we focus on cases that do not involves the biasing influence of mistaken moral norms.

Next, the universalist can point out that there is an important difference between competent judges in a society finding it rational to hold people responsible versus believing they are responsible. Our own society uses the legal doctrine of strict liability in some contexts where significant practical reasons pull in that direction though we do not think that the propriety of strict liability is equivalent to being morally responsible. Similarly, the Icelandic judges plausibly do not think Sam's brother is responsible for Sam's crime. Instead, they accept norms that permit punishing Sam by killing his brother.

Finally, the universalist may be able to allow for some variation in intuition even after factoring out the influence of problematic moral norms if the variance reflects the use of a shared concept of moral responsibility with cross-culturally similar conditions of application. Sommers' argument focuses on a particular concept of moral responsibility: "to believe that someone is morally responsible for an action in this sense is to believe that the person deserves blame or praise and perhaps punishment or reward" independently of practical or consequentialist benefits that may arise (10). If Sommers is right that different cultures really disagree about assignments of moral responsibility, they must at least agree about the nature of the concept, though they diverge in their thinking about when it is appropriately applied. However, even if Sommers is right that intuitions about exactly when people are morally responsible differ, there appears to be widespread cross-cultural agreement regarding the importance of identification (of people with actions and results, and individuals with groups) and control in attributions of moral responsibility. Persons or groups are typically judged morally responsible for an action or outcome only if they are thought to identify in some way with the result, or had some chance at control over it. Hrafnkels retaliates against Sam by killing Sam's brother, not by killing some unrelated clan member; that this is a more rational retaliation strategy is surely something that can be cross-culturally appreciated.

Most of the literature on the compatibility question that Sommers takes to task for its universalism has been focused on skeptical challenges to the very possibility of agential control or identifying agents as the source of their choices. Thus there is a sense in which the literature might be understood as addressing the universally important issues for moral responsibility. The universalist must grant, however, that the issue of whether it is ever appropriate to attribute moral responsibility to individuals or groups is not the typical concern of people engaged in the day-to-day practice of holding each other responsible.

As the complexity of the argument sketched above suggests, however, Sommers has at least put a significant burden of response on the universalist. Assuming this to be the case, the latter half of the book concerns the "where do we go from here?" question that emerges from this pressure. It assumes the cogency of Sommers' argument in favor of metaskepticism about moral responsibility and examines the implications of the view. Sommers focuses on illuminating the similarities and differences between metaskepticism and other skeptical and nontraditional views about moral responsibility, discussing the social and political implications of his view, and presenting a theory for approaching issues of moral responsibility consistent with metaskepticism. The upshot of the latter is that metaskepticism implies that theories of moral responsibility cannot be evaluated in terms of their truth or falsity, so choosing between them must mean relying on factors like the psychological difficulty of jettisoning them, whether the theory coheres with other well-justified beliefs, and the pragmatic or moral value of the view (132). Sommers then turns to assessing libertarianism, compatibilism, and skepticism about moral responsibility on these grounds.

Sommers' consideration of these issues covers an array of assertions about the benefits, psychological attractiveness, or psychological necessity of these different views from a wide variety of contemporary theorists. To take a few recent examples, Robert Kane claims that objective worth is only compatible with libertarianism, Susan Wolf indicts pessimism about moral responsibility as gruesome and shallow, and Shaun Nichols argues that cooperation would deteriorate if we stopped blaming each other for the wrongs we commit. Sommers convincingly shows that the benefits and harms of these various philosophical positions on moral responsibility have been consistently overblown: it is unclear which position, if any, can claim to be better supported on pragmatic or moral grounds.

Sommers' closing chapter offers a tentative defense of eliminativism about moral responsibility on the modest grounds that it is fairer to not hold people responsible for what they do and that the practical cost of not holding people responsible is not too high. The issues here are partly investigated in an uncommon but welcome manner for a philosophical monograph: Sommers reports his own psychological conflict about these issues, related especially to the birth of his daughter. For some time a committed denier of moral responsibility, as a new parent Sommers imagines someone deliberately and willfully harming his newborn child and then considers how he would react. He muses, "I would feel that the offender deserved to suffer for the act . . . it would be wrong not to feel this way" (196). He admits to being unable to form a wholly coherent view, so his first-order skepticism remains "tortured" (his own words).

The book closes with the suggestion of a philosopher living in and wrestling seriously with the views he considers, not simply reporting on arguments from the safety of the armchair. It thus highlights that moral responsibility is complex, it matters deeply, and it is something we must all wrestle with, no matter our cultural starting points. Sommers' book is essential reading for anyone of similar mind.

1 For the acronym, see Joseph Henrich, Steven J. Heine, and Ara Norenzayan, "The Weirdest People in the World?" Behavioral and Brain Sciences 33, no. 2-3 (2010): 61-83. Significant discussion follows the article.

2 For a representative example, see Shaun Nichols, Stephen Stich, and Jonathan Weinberg, "Metaskepticism: Meditations in Ethno-epistemology," in The Skeptics, ed. S. Luper (Aldershot, England: Ashgate, 2003), 227-247.