Relative Truth

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Manuel García-Carpintero and Max Kölbel (eds.), Relative Truth, Oxford University Press, 2008, 314pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199234943.

Reviewed by Paul McCallion, University of St. Andrews


Recent work in the philosophy of language has led to a resurgence of interest in relativism. This volume is in large part the outcome of the international workshop 'Relativising Utterance Truth', held in Barcelona in 2005. In its current guise, relativism about truth is the thesis that propositional truth is relative not only to a world (as orthodoxy would have it) but also to some non-standard parameter such as a perspective, standard of taste, context of assessment and so on. Relative Truth is a unique and wide-ranging collection of high quality essays in this quickly developing field.

A central issue is whether relativism provides the best explanation of puzzling linguistic data. To take just one example, there is the appearance of faultless disagreement in matters of taste (see Kölbel (2003)). It has been suggested that on grounds of this sort we should embrace relativism about taste, values, epistemic modals, knowledge and even the Aristotelian 'Open Future'. All of these topics receive discussion in the collection; indeed, its scope is impressive. There is also material which addresses traditional misgivings about relativism (in particular its metaphysical implications and the classic self-refutation objection). Each paper in the volume makes an original contribution to the debate.

The remainder of this review contains an outline of each paper and some brief remarks. The volume opens with Max Kölbel's paper "Introduction: Motivations for Relativism". Kölbel provides a detailed account of how relativism may be motivated as a response to apparent faultless disagreement over matters of taste. He then summarises the areas in which a relativist treatment may be appropriate. The discussion is complicated, partly because Kölbel works with two closely correlated but distinct notions, namely, propositional truth and utterance truth. He needs the latter for his discussion of the adjustments to 'standard semantics' that are arguably motivated by the linguistic data. The majority of the papers in the volume, however, work centrally with the more intuitive concept of (relativised) propositional truth. The introductory goal of the paper may therefore have been better served had less emphasis been placed on utterance truth.

The remainder of the volume is divided into four parts. The first, Relativism Elaborated, begins with François Recanati's "Moderate Relativism" in which he defends the relativity of propositional truth against two classic objections (from Evans (1985) and Richard (1981)) to temporal relativism. In addition, he addresses the phenomenon of apparent faultless disagreement, making the suggestion that 'It is beautiful' means "something like It is beautiful for us" (p. 59). Since at least one of the parties in a dispute over, say, the beauty of a painting must then be mistaken, we are left on this account with the unexplained appearance of faultlessness. A separate difficulty arises from cases in which someone insists that a painting is beautiful in the face of evidence that no-one else finds it so. Recanati suggests that we should interpret such judgements as progressive rather than representative (where the function of progressive judgements is to shape our collective standards).

Stefano Predelli and Isidora Stojanovic trace the consequences of shifting from standard to relativist semantics. In their paper "Semantic Relativism and the Logic of Indexicals", they discuss the motivation for (what they call) 'Kaplan's Classic Reduction'. This is the identification of the elements required for the interpretation of indexicals and the parameters needed to define truth. They also consider the effect of relativist semantics on the interaction between indexicality and intensionality.

"Truth in the Garden of Forking Paths" is a new instalment in John MacFarlane's attempt to make sense of our talk and thought about the future while respecting the branching worlds picture of reality. In previous work (e.g. MacFarlane (2003)), he argued that the best non-relativist treatment of utterance truth runs into difficulties with respect to retrospective assessments of future-tensed assertions. Since in ordinary contexts we tend to ascribe truth to propositions rather than utterances, MacFarlane here assesses the benefits of relativism with respect to propositional truth. He concludes that relativism makes best sense of our intuitive or "common sense" judgements about statements that involve the natural language expression 'actually'. However, 'actually' is used in all sorts of ways and as a result it can be unclear what the content of one of these intuitive judgements is (on this point, see Brogaard (2008)). As a consequence, it is unclear whether MacFarlane has really identified evidence that favours relativism.

The next paper in the volume addresses an epistemological puzzle. In "Margins for Error in Context", Denis Bonnay and Paul Egré propose a new way in which to make the margin for error and KK principles compatible. They modify the standard Kripke-Hintikka semantics by introducing a perspectival parameter. While this strategy bears a formal resemblance to that of the relativist, this paper marks a divergence from the more traditional relativist themes of the collection (indeed, the authors describe their own approach as 'contextualist').

Manuel García-Carpintero begins his contribution "Relativism, Vagueness and What is Said" with an assessment of what is at stake in the relativism debate, and distinguishes two forms of relativism: moderate and radical. He then argues against the radical relativist treatment of gradable adjectives in Richard (2004) and defends a moderate relativist account.

The second part, The Metaphysical Significance of Relativism, opens with Crispin Wright's contribution "Relativism about Truth Itself: Haphazard Thoughts about the Very Idea". Wright begins with a useful discussion of what, intuitively, relativism about a given subject matter consists in, and he shows how this will interact with relativism about truth itself. He then distinguishes two forms of relativism, one on which truth is a ternary relation that relates a proposition to a world and a perspective, and another on which it is a binary relation between a proposition and a world. He conjectures that the former leads to a conception of propositions on which they are non-representational, while the latter requires a pluralistic conception of the actual.

In "Three Forms of Truth Relativism", Iris Einheuser develops in admirable detail (what amounts to) a version of Wright's second form of relativism with respect to epistemic modals and matters of taste. The two papers in this part are an important inclusion in the volume: little of the contemporary discussion of relativism focuses on how we should conceive of propositional content and reality if relativism were true. (A minor editorial complaint: p. 168 and p. 184 contain reference to a paper as "in this volume" but it is not included (see also p. 188).)

The third part, Objections to Relativism, contains three papers containing detailed assessments of relativist construals of disagreement. In "Assertion, Belief and Disagreement" Sebastiano Moruzzi introduces a descendant of the classic self-refutation argument against relativism. He argues that -- in the form developed by MacFarlane -- relativism fails to explain how disputes over a matter of taste can be rational.

In "Frege, Relativism and Faultless Disagreement", Sven Rosenkranz considers whether a relativist about matters of taste can really make sense of faultless disagreement (where A and B faultlessly disagree just in case (i) A believes P and B believes ~P, and yet (ii) neither A's belief nor B's belief is incorrect (Kölbel (2003: 53-4))). He suggests a dilemma for the relativist. If to assert is to present as true simpliciter, then neither party in the dispute is faultless; if to assert is to present as true from one's perspective, there is no disagreement. A puzzling aspect of the discussion is that for the dilemma to have force we apparently would have to conceive of disagreement in terms of assertion rather than belief.

Richard Dietz argues against relativist treatments of epistemic modals in his contribution "Epistemic Modals and Correct Disagreement". According to relativism, claims must be assessed relative to the state of knowledge of the assessor at the time of assessment. By considering various conversational scenarios in detail, Dietz shows that relativism poorly handles situations in which the assessor has less information than the one who made the claim, and he offers a contextualist alternative.

The fourth and final part of the volume, Alternatives to Relativism, contains three papers that aim to show how theories other than relativism can handle the linguistic data thought to support it. In "Content Relativism and Semantic Blindness", Herman Cappelen argues that if one accepts Pluralistic Content Relativism (according to which a single utterance typically involves the assertion of a plurality of propositions), then the linguistic data offered in favour of relativism does not favour it over rival semantic theories such as contextualism and invariantism. Cappelen discusses both MacFarlane's (2005) argument for the assessment-sensitivity of 'know', and Lasersohn's (2005) presentation of cases of apparent faultless disagreement. Regarding the latter, suppose that A utters "Roller coasters are fun" and B utters "Roller coasters are not fun". Cappelen's diagnosis is that our intuitions of faultlessness and disagreement arise from paying varying attention to the many propositions expressed by A and B. On the one hand, A expresses the proposition that roller coasters are fun for A, and B expresses the proposition that roller coasters are not fun for B; focus on these propositions gives rise to the intuition that both parties speak truly. On the other hand, there is a proposition that A asserts and B denies; focus on this proposition gives rise to the intuition that they disagree. The least persuasive part of the discussion is the explanation of the intuition of disagreement. Cappelen does not take a stand on exactly which proposition is asserted by A and denied by B.

Andrea Iacona sounds a similar note in "Faultless or Disagreement", arguing that there are no genuine faultless disagreements. A distinction is made between 'subjective' and 'objective' uses of sentences which apparently express matters of taste. On the proposed analysis, the former but not the latter convey an indexical content. With subjective uses we therefore have faultlessness without disagreement; with objective uses we have disagreement and inevitably fault.

The final paper in the collection is "Presuppositions of Commonality: An Indexical Relativist Account of Disagreement" by Dan López de Sa. He defends indexical relativism about taste. This is the view that sentences expressing matters of taste are implicitly indexical (e.g. when I assert 'Homer is funny' I express the proposition that I find Homer funny). This explains the appearance of faultlessness, but not the appearance of disagreement. López de Sa defends a complex version of indexical relativism in which conversational presuppositions of commonality play a role in providing for the appearance of disagreement.

In conclusion, Relative Truth is a well-organised and challenging collection. It significantly advances the contemporary discussion of relativism.


Brogaard, Berit (2008), "Sea Battle Semantics", Philosophical Quarterly 58, 326-35.

Evans, Gareth (1985), "Does Tense Logic Rest on a Mistake", in his Collected Papers, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 341-63.

Kölbel, Max (2003), "Faultless Disagreement", Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 104: 53-73.

Richard, Mark (1981), "Temporalism and Eternalism", Philosophical Studies 39: 1-13.

MacFarlane, John (2003), "Future Contingents and Relative Truth", Philosophical Quarterly 53: 321-36.

---- (2005), "Making Sense of Relative Truth", Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 105: 321-39.