Relativism and the Foundations of Philosophy

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Steven D. Hales, Relativism and the Foundations of Philosophy, MIT Press, 2006, 216pp., $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262083531.

Reviewed by Andrew D. Cling, University of Alabama, Huntsville


This interesting book is chock full of arguments on a wide range of important topics in logic, epistemology, the philosophy of science, metaphysics, and metaphilosophy. Hales argues that since there is no reason to prefer any particular method of forming philosophical beliefs to other methods that give incompatible results, we must be skeptics, nihilists, or relativists about philosophical propositions. Skepticism holds that we can have no knowledge of philosophical propositions, nihilism holds that what appear to be philosophical propositions are either not propositions or not distinctively philosophical, and relativism holds that philosophical propositions are true or false only relative to perspectives that are partly constituted by characteristic belief-forming methods. None of these positions is entirely palatable, says Hales, but there is a sound argument for philosophical relativism and there are good reasons to reject skepticism and nihilism.

Hales' project begins with a skeptical problem for philosophical method. There are at least three sources of beliefs about philosophical propositions: rational intuition, Christian revelation, and the ritual use of hallucinogenic drugs. Each of these sources gives rise to non-inferential, basic beliefs that, even when shaped into a system of beliefs in wide reflective equilibrium, are frequently incompatible with the beliefs that result from the other methods. Christian revelation and the ritual use of hallucinogens, for example, support the belief that the mind is separate from the body, but this is rejected by most who rely only on rational intuition (pp. 65-66, 73). The skeptical problem is that none of these methods can be shown to be preferable to the others without assuming its own reliability. Externalists will protest that knowledge does not require that we be able to show that our methods are reliable. It is enough that our method be reliable. Hales rejects externalism because it provides no basis for choosing between conflicting methods. In particular, there can be no neutral perspective from which to choose between incompatible methods for thinking about philosophical propositions (p. 89).

Given this problem, we are left with a choice between skepticism, nihilism, and relativism about philosophical propositions. Hales argues that skepticism is false since it results in paradox and that there are no good reasons for naturalist or non-naturalist versions of nihilism. That leaves relativism about philosophical propositions which is, he thinks, supported by a sound argument.

The success of Hales' relativism depends upon quarantining the propositions that are relatively true. For he agrees with many philosophers that total relativism -- the view that nothing is absolutely true -- is self-refuting. Hales does an excellent job of formulating this objection. To explicate relativism, he makes use of perspectives, "abstract intensional objects" that are "ways of knowing" (p. 113). The root idea of a perspective, I take it, is that it is a way of thinking about things that is partly constituted by methods of forming non-inferential beliefs and shaping them into a system in wide reflective equilibrium. Thus total relativism is the view that (TR) "every proposition is true in some perspective and not true in another" (pp. 100-101). Absolutism is not-(TR), "there is at least one proposition that has the same truth-value in all perspectives" (p. 101). Suppose that (TR) is true. It follows that relativism is either absolutely true or only relatively true. If relativism is absolutely true, then some proposition -- (TR) itself -- is true in all perspectives. So (TR) is false. If relativism is only relatively true, then not-(TR) is true in some perspective. Not-(TR) is true in some perspective only if it is true in that perspective that some proposition P is true in all perspectives. This implies -- given the perspectival analogue of a theorem of S5 alethic modal logic, if it is true in some perspective that P is true in every perspective, then P is true in every perspective -- that P is true in every perspective. So (TR) is false. So if relativism is either absolutely or relatively true, it is false. Therefore relativism is inconsistent and therefore false (pp. 100-101).

If the relativist is to avoid inconsistency, (TR) must be abandoned. Hales argues that relativism should not be expressed by (TR) but by (R) "whatever is true is relatively true" (p. 102). (R) is the perspectival analogue of the alethic modal principle that every true proposition is possibly true. Unlike (TR), (R) is compatible with some, or even all, claims being absolutely true. Indeed, a consistent relativism requires that some propositions be absolutely true, including (R) itself. (R) leaves room, however, for some apparently incompatible claims to be only relatively true. Limited relativism has the benefit of avoiding inconsistency and of shifting philosophical attention to arguments for and against thinking that some propositions are only relatively true. Hales' account of relativism is developed in detail in Chapter 3, which includes a substantial technical appendix that introduces perspectival operators to standard quantified modal logic. The chapter also contains interesting discussions of the concept of commensurability and of how a perspectival account of truth can explain commensurability in terms of an accessibility relation between alternative perspectives.

The keystone of this chapter, and of the book as a whole, is Hales' argument for philosophical relativism. He argues that (1) either we can acquire philosophical knowledge using at least one of the methods he considers -- rational intuition, Christian revelation, the ritual use of hallucinogens -- or in none of these ways. However, (2) if we can acquire philosophical knowledge in none of these ways, then skepticism about philosophical propositions is true. But (3) skepticism is false, so (4) we can acquire philosophical knowledge using at least one of these methods. He next assumes, for reductio, that (5) we can acquire philosophical knowledge in at most one of these ways. (6) If this were true, then we would have a good reason to prefer one of the listed methods to the others. It follows that (7) we have a good reason to prefer one of the listed methods to the others. This contradicts the conclusion of the skeptical problem for philosophical method. Therefore (8) it is false that we can acquire philosophical knowledge in at most one of these ways. Given (4) and (8) it follows that (9) we can acquire philosophical knowledge using more than one of these methods. Since what is known is true and (10) these methods yield inconsistent results, it follows that (11) for some philosophical proposition P, P is true in some perspective and not-P is true in another, so relativism is true for philosophical propositions (pp. 120-121). The book concludes with a chapter presenting arguments against various attempts to show that philosophical propositions are empirical and not distinctively philosophical.

I have paraphrased only the arguments that are central to Hales' project. I encourage those interested to read the book with the care it deserves. The arguments are invariably provocative and are presented with admirable clarity and verve. I conclude with some objections.

The skeptical problem for philosophical method is serious, but it is broader than Hales recognizes. For any general source of data is liable to be such that it cannot be shown to be reliable without using data from that very source. Furthermore, if sources of data provide knowledge only if they can be shown to be reliable without circularity or infinite regress, then some source of data must have this characteristic, if we have any knowledge. Every source validated by this source will be afflicted as well. So if all sources of knowledge must be validated, all are afflicted. This is the problem of the criterion in its most comprehensive form: any justification for the reliability of a source of data will be circular or lead to an infinite regress, so we cannot know that any source of data is reliable or have any knowledge. Sensory experience and memory, for example, are afflicted by this problem as much as the specialized sources of philosophical data that Hales focuses on. Indeed, in Chapter 4 Hales uses the skeptical problem against attempts to validate the methods of empirical social science (pp. 176-177). Hales might respond that empirical propositions do not purport to be necessary truths in the way that philosophical propositions do and do not result in propositions that conflict with the propositions that originate from sources of philosophical data. Not so. First, contrary to Hales (p. 14), not even all of the philosophical propositions he considers purport to be necessary truths. The propositions that are constitutive of Descartes' cogito -- I think, therefore I am -- are contingent. Second, empirical propositions can conflict with the allegedly necessary truths acquired in non-empirical ways. Darwinian evolutionary theory, for example, is incompatible with the account of the origin of species given in Genesis. Popular interpretations of quantum mechanics are incompatible with a natural interpretation of the principle that every event has a cause. Since ought implies can and true propositions are possibly true, the results of psychological research can conflict with moral propositions, as Hales notes (p. 39). It is, therefore, difficult to quarantine the propositions that are subject to the skeptical problem. But if the problem afflicts all propositions and we must be relativists about afflicted propositions, then we are driven to total relativism after all. Since total relativism is inconsistent, there is a mistake somewhere in Hales' reasoning.

Skepticism is more resilient than Hales recognizes. This is especially true of the weak and limited skepticism that he must show to be false, knowledge skepticism about philosophical propositions: (KSP) we can have no knowledge of philosophical propositions. Hales employs the common strategy of arguing against "the skeptic." In fact, the deepest skeptical problems -- including the problem of the criterion -- stem from the fact that the impossibility of knowledge seems to follow from plausible assumptions about what is required for knowledge, whether or not anyone can bear or believe those consequences. So Hales' claim to find propositions that "the skeptic" must assert (p. 93) is misguided. Even if there are skeptics committed to making problematic claims, this will not show how to avoid the underlying paradoxes.

(KSP) is a weak and limited version of skepticism that is quite plausible. It is clear, however, that Hales' argument for relativism is sound only if (KSP) is false. For he must show that we can have knowledge, and not merely reasonable beliefs, in order to establish the truth of apparently incompatible propositions. Hales notes that if (KSP) is true, then it cannot be known to be true, since (KSP) is philosophical. This does not show that (KSP) is false but Hales claims that it leads to a version of the knower paradox (I quote Hales):

Argument 1

(1) If skepticism about philosophical propositions is true, then we can't know the truth of any philosophical proposition. (Definition of skepticism)

(2) Skepticism is a philosophical proposition. (Premise)

(3) Therefore, p: if skepticism about philosophical propositions is true, we can't know it. (From 1, 2) (p. 92)

There is an equally cogent argument to the effect that the conclusion of Argument 1 cannot be known (Hales again):

Argument 2

(1) If skepticism about philosophical propositions is true, then we can't know the truth of any philosophical proposition. (Definition of skepticism)

(2) p [=(3) in Argument 1] is a philosophical proposition. (Premise)

(3) Therefore, if skepticism about philosophical propositions is true, then we can't know that p [=(3) in Argument 1]. (From 1, 2) (p. 93)

This is no paradox. The premises of both arguments are reasonable but the conclusions are not only consistent but reasonable. A paradox moves from plausible premises to an implausible conclusion.

Hales' argument against (KSP), I take it, is that since (RP) we recognize Arguments 1 and 2  to be proofs and (RK) recognizing a proof results in knowledge, we know that p. Since this is incompatible with (KSP), (KSP) is false.

This argument fails. For if the propositions that are constitutive of these arguments are philosophical, then (RP) begs the question against (KSP). If, on the other hand, we are unclear about the distinction between philosophical and non-philosophical propositions, we may doubt that p is a philosophical proposition and thus doubt the second premise of Argument 2. (Hales admits that he cannot draw this line and rests content with picking out the class of philosophical propositions by examples (p. 21).) Nor is this objection facile, for it is plausible that although p is a claim about philosophical propositions, p is a non-philosophical conceptual truth. Even if these objections to Hales' argument against (KSP) fail, we can coherently maintain both (KSP) and that Argument 1 and Argument 2 are reasonable. For it is perfectly consistent to maintain both (KSP) and that we have a good reason to believe some philosophical propositions and not others. So Hales does not defeat (KSP) and this undermines his argument for philosophical relativism.

Hales' argument for philosophical relativism fails even if (KSP) is false. A key assumption is that if we can acquire philosophical knowledge in none of the canvassed ways -- intuition, revelation, drug use -- then (KSP) is true. This is true only if the methods that he considers are the only ways to acquire philosophical knowledge. This is doubtful, but the argument need only assume that either we can acquire philosophical knowledge in some way, or we cannot. I have noted the problems with Hales' argument against (KSP), but there is another problem downstream. For even if there are at least two methods that conflict with respect to a proposition P and these methods are sources of knowledge, it does not follow that both P and not-P are known. This follows only if we suppose that every proposition sanctioned by a source of knowledge is known, which is false.

Finally, I am unable to understand how non-normative philosophical propositions -- metaphysical propositions, for example -- could be only relatively true. I think I can understand how at least some normative propositions might be true only in some perspectives. For I find it intelligible that human interests make moral propositions true, that human interests are grounded in features of human nature, and that some of the relevant features of human nature are constituted by social facts. So it is not implausible to think that human nature varies and that moral propositions are only relatively true. A great service provided by Hales is that he provides conceptual resources needed to make such a view consistent. What would it be, however, for a proposition such as the mind survives the death of the body to be true in some perspectives and not others? I will either survive the death of my body or I will not, I cannot do so in one perspective and not in another. What makes this proposition true or false is not something that is partly constituted by the perspectives in which it is thought and accepted. Despite the fact that he spends time in Chapter 3 discussing connections between relativism and various theories of truth, I find no satisfying account of just what relative truth is.

Hales' book makes a significant contribution to our understanding of relativism. His defense of philosophical relativism fails, but he does succeed in showing that proponents and opponents of various limited versions of relativism "can quit arguing about the self-refutation problem, or talking past each other, and consider reasons for and against strong relativist claims on an equal footing" (p. 104).[1]

[1] I am very grateful to my colleague Nicholaos Jones for numerous discussions on these topics and for very helpful comments on earlier drafts of this review.