Religion After Metaphysics

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Wrathall, Mark A. (ed), Religion After Metaphysics, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 202pp, $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 0521531969

Reviewed by Graham Ward , University of Manchester


Toward the end of her own essay Leora Batnitzky remarks: “the debate about ’religion after metaphysics’ reveals more about the current status (or lack of status) of philosophy than it does about ’religion’“ (p.161). And that is certainly true of this volume of ten essays (and an Introduction) written by some of the intellectual stars of the continental philosophy school. The key term ’religion’ is remarkably undefined, which gives rise to something of an irony about most of the work in the collection – for the centre of attention is the metaphysical project itself. I start with this observation because there are any number of books now on postmodern thinking and the ’end of metaphysics’. Some of these books have actually been written by contributors – Vattimo and Marion, for example. Because this is so, while the volume is an interesting collection of essays, and on several occasions offers some very useful accounts of various philosophical projects from Kant to Derrida, it is not groundbreaking. The thin and unfocussed Introduction is indicative of this, as are the predictable visitations to the standard sites of post-metaphysics.

The collection opens with the first of such visitations: an exploration by Robert Pippin of Nietzsche’s pronouncement of ’the death of God’. The pronouncement is approached from an original direction - on desire. The essay is explicitly part of a larger project on modernity and melancholia – a project that I hope picks up George Steiner’s much earlier observations on the relationship between liberal humanism and ennui in his lectures Out of Bluebeard’s Castle. The project sounds immensely significant as a genealogy, and the essay has interest because of the larger cultural trajectory that it continually alludes to. For example, the idea that with Zarathustra we find “the advent of nihilism as an erotic problem” (p.15) opens a number of important questions for the philosophers of desire who followed in the wake of Nietzsche. Pippin points to but does not enter this territory, but he does indicate something of the way this affects faith (or the lack of it) – as of course he must do because this is a collection of essays on religion.

The essay that follows by Gianni Vattimo picks up and runs with the Nietzsche and introduces another of the predictable points of reference for the post-metaphysical debate, Heidegger on onto-theology. This is a thin essay, useful only insofar as it gives a summary of Vattimo’s own project and draws attention to the questions being raised with respect to the secularisation thesis. More attention to what increasingly is being described by social scientists (including Habermas) as ’post-secularity’ would, in my opinion, have made this volume far more original. Discussions then would have focused more on what is religion after metaphysics. Rorty’s essay, that succeeds Vattimo’s, again toys with the phenomenon of secularism and the new visibility of religion, but it too is a thin piece of analysis responding to Vattimo’s “privatised religion” (p.43). Neither of the essays treats secularism in any depth, nor the tensions in Vattimo’s own position. Cultural politics aside, had these essays been dropped from the collection there would have been no great loss.

That cannot be said of the fourth essay, by Charles Taylor. Taylor brings his enormous intellectual resources, philosophical, sociological and historical, into an examination of “the modern landscape of belief/unbelief”(p.66). He develops his notion of ’closed world structures’, the cultural power that they can wield and the resistances they agenda. What emerges is a chequered terrain in which worlds that open to belief in God contest worlds that effectively “slide towards forms of deism, and ultimately atheistic humanism” (p.64). What is being thought through here – and continued in much of Taylor’s recent work – is the relationship between modernity and secularity that already begins to challenge theories of secularism (the early work of Peter Berger and the more contemporary work of Steve Bruce, for example). What this contestation of closed world structures results in, for Taylor, is an exponential multiplication of possibilities that he terms the ’nova effect’ – and this is where we stand today.

Almost on cue, Taylor ends with one example of this nova effect - Heidegger’s investigations into das Geviert. This becomes the central topic of Mark Wrathall’s own contribution that follows. This essay could almost be a systematic exposition of what Taylor is suggesting. As an exposition of das Geviert it is again useful and clear (the kind of account one can give to students). Wrathall links it to Heidegger’s lectures on Nietzsche and particularly Heidegger’s interpretation of ’the death of God’ as the death of the God of metaphysics. With the return to the ’gods’ in his examination of the fourfold correlation between earth, sky, morals and divinities, Heidegger opens to the way beyond this dead God to a new sacrality now embodied in our present world. Wrathall laments that this still has Christian overtones in Heidegger, but suggests what is offered allows for the possibility of worship. This all sounds very eco-friendly, and turns Heidegger into a champion for new-age spirituality, but I’m unsure that this gets us religiously beyond paganism. This reading stands in need of Marion’s detailed and aporetic reading of Heidegger’s attention to es gibt – and Marion’s own development of that theme in terms of donation. This will be Marion’s very useful contribution to the collection, and the final essay. But the fact that it comes at the end rather than following Wrathall’s essay draws attention to the absence in this collection of a ’round-table’ or plenary in which contributors might have disrupted and contested each other’s readings.

The link between Wrathall’s essay and the one that follows it, by Hubert L. Dreyfus, is provided through an allusion to Dreyfus’s (and Spinosa’s) work on Heidegger. But what is interesting is the way Dreyfus moves the discussion away from philosophical reappraisal of Heidegger’s “conservative paganism” (p.89) to the theological and concrete. Dreyfus outlines Kierkegaard’s radical Christian view of the self. It is an existential reading of what Dreyfus terms a “horizontal transcendence” (p.98) that does not evade the centrality of Christ, the incarnate God, for Kierkegaard. In fact, the essay challenges Wrathall’s pagan sense of the sacred by claiming that here is a “more rewarding form of religion” (p.101). Again, what is absent – and screams for being included – is Wrathall’s response to this claim.

With Dreyfus we have the first of three theological (all Christian) responses in the collection to onto-theology. The others will come from Adrian Peperzak and John D. Caputo. With Peperzak we return to Heidegger and a commentary on another of the set pieces for the ’end of metaphysics’: the essay on ’The Onto-Logical Constitution of Metaphysics’. Peperzak’s contribution is quirky, individual and refreshing. It is also wide ranging – from Descartes and Spinoza to Levinas and the Muslim, Jewish and Christian philosophical theologies of the Middle Ages. It is one of the most original contributions to the collection, moving beyond commentary to argue for the continuing appeal of religion to onto-theology. It argues for the need for a notion of transcendent ’presence’ rather than either divine absence or pantheism. This is an essay well worth rereading and expanding (and I hope Peperzak is doing this currently).

Caputo’s essay most naturally carries on where Dreyfus left off, though there are links with Peperzak’s reappraisal of the role of experience; for Caputo picks up the Kierkegaard reference while developing a phenomenological account of experiencing the impossible. The essay is very good, and somewhat surprising. Early in the piece we have a reference to Derrida (so important for Caputo’s examination of radical hermeneutics), but, for once, Derrida and expositions of Derrida do not steal the show. Caputo offers a sensitive, theological reading of believing, hoping and loving beyond all ontological possibilities. It appeals to both the Jewish and the Christian traditions, though the triad of faith, hope and love is evidently Pauline.

Leora Batnitsky’s essay on Levinas and Leo Strauss reorients us – both towards more philosophical approaches to religion (revelation in this instance) and towards what has been happening in Jewish thinking in the twentieth century. Batnitsky’s essay is interesting, suggestive and original – another essay well worth its inclusion in this collection; another essay one hopes is being expanded into a full-length study. As I said at the beginning she underlines how much the philosophical is leading this question of the new visibility of religion. Jean-Luc Marion’s return to giving an exposition of Heidegger, the last essay, reinforces the point. Marion’s examination of es gibt provides in fact a succinct and lucid summary of his own phenomenological project, and that is why it is useful. But the essay leads only finally to Marion’s question, “What speaks in the ’It gives’?” (p.184). It leads to an aporia that, as Paul Ricoeur pointed out in his Oneself as Another, can be answered in terms of deism, the Freudian id, the Good beyond being or nihilism. Aporia as such is surely another idealistic (metaphysical) abstraction. It is just this aporia that more attention to religion and secularism rather than the overcoming of metaphysics might have grounded. The specificities of religious practices and pieties get short shift and yet, to my mind, this is where the most important work needs to be done. Something more original still waits to be attempted, beyond more exegeses and comments upon what have already become the set pieces and the usual suspects at the end of metaphysics. Nevertheless, the collection is well put together and the editorial hand is visible and firmly in control. The result is some interesting and useful analyses, and a few gems that dare to go further.