Religion and Identity in Porphyry of Tyre: The Limits of Hellenism in Late Antiquity

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Aaron P. Johnson, Religion and Identity in Porphyry of Tyre: The Limits of Hellenism in Late Antiquity, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 374pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107012738.

Reviewed by Jaclyn Maxwell, Ohio University


This book examines Porphyry of Tyre's seemingly contradictory concern with transcendent Platonic truth as well as the numerous conceptions of truth in different cultures within and beyond the Roman Empire. Although we might imagine that late Platonist philosophers must have been detached from their own societies and focused primarily on contemplating the First Principle, Johnson demonstrates that Porphyry was intellectually engaged with the material world around him, and attempted to make philosophical sense of the multitude of earthly religious rituals and wisdom traditions from various cultures.

Porphyry (c. 232-c. 305), whose original name was Malchus, left his home in Phoenicia to study in Athens. He then moved to Rome to study under Plotinus, and later formed his own philosophical school there. Because of his Phoenician origins, scholars have assumed that Porphyry's intellectual development could be seen as the progression from "Oriental" superstition to rational, Hellenized philosophy. As a result, his works have been assigned to earlier or later parts of his life based on their perceived "superstition" versus "rationality." Johnson persuasively dismantles this deeply flawed view of Porphyry's work. In addition to questioning the outdated and unwarranted ideas about "oriental superstition" and "western rationality," Johnson demonstrates that instead of a dramatic change over time and/or intellectual inconsistency, Porphyry's work reflects a stable, coherent philosophical worldview centered on the transcendence of the Platonic One or First Principle. Much of Porphyry's work survives only in fragments embedded in polemics against him by both pagan and Christian authors, so it is perhaps not surprising that his work has often been misconstrued. Johnson aims to correct misconceptions about Porphyry, while situating Porphyry's work in the framework of current scholarship on issues related to identity and ethnicity.

The book is divided into two distinct parts: "Porphyry the Theologian" followed by "Porphyry the Ethnographer." In the first part, Johnson covers such topics as Porphyry's taxonomy of divine beings, his views on the origins and reliability of oracles, his critique of traditional religious sacrifices, and his teaching on these matters to his students. Porphyry's attitudes toward traditional polytheistic religion have been misconstrued, with some scholars picturing him as a defender of Hellenism and, in particular, a champion of paganism. Johnson demonstrates that the philosopher's attitude toward traditional Greek religion tended more toward criticism than anything else. His philosophical cosmology had room for the traditional gods, but assigned them to a relatively low level. In this way, Porphyry resituated the traditional gods into a Platonic philosophical system; Johnson calls this process "theological translation" (55).

Porphyry's terminology for the Olympian gods, however, varied. He categorized them as daemons, at a lower level than gods in the hierarchy reaching down from the First Principle into the embodied souls of the material world. Porphyry sometimes refers to the Olympians as gods, other times as daemons. Johnson persuasively argues that this ambiguity is not a weakness in Porphyry's philosophy, but a sign of his flexibility. Porphyry sometimes chose to use common terms (the Olympians as gods) and sometimes used more precise philosophical terms (daemons). Porphyry also sometimes used "god" in reference to the One/First Principle, which was far superior to anything else that might be called a god. Johnson makes the excellent point that rather than trying to "catch" the ancient author in contradictions, we should consider each example within its original context. Previous scholars used instances like this (were the Olympians gods or daemons?) as a way to divide Porphyry's work into irrational (approving of polytheism and sacrifices, oracles) and rational (rejecting those beliefs and practices in favor of philosophy). Johnson interprets these seeming inconsistencies in a more sophisticated way. Instead of progress toward rationality, Johnson describes Porphyry's approach as flexible: "He seems to have adopted an accommodationist (or theologically hybrid) stance . . . . Throughout his theological discussions, Porphyry exhibits a flexible yet consistently Platonic (even Plotinian) philosophical vision" (58). The philosopher did not change his mind because he moved westward; instead, he adjusted his terms depending on whether the context called for a more religious or a more philosophical vocabulary. We, unlike his detractors, can understand his references to the One, to the Demiurge and to the Olympians as "gods," without assuming that he was conflating these different levels of beings and thus contradicting his own philosophy.

Since Porphyry did not consider the Olympian gods to be very lofty beings, it is not surprising to learn that he did not approve of how people typically worshipped and/or consulted them. In his discussion of sacrifices and oracles, Johnson counters the view that Porphyry was a defender of paganism who attempted to "dress popular religion in philosophical garb" (81). Instead, Johnson shows that Porphyry was consistently critical of the so-called gods, assigning them a fairly low place in the hierarchy of beings, consistent with other Platonists. In certain texts, Porphyry describes beliefs about oracles and astrology, but his own judgment was "within a spectrum that ranges from outright criticism to dismissive ambivalence, not an open (or even tentative) acceptance" (123). Among the other misconceptions about Porphyry is the idea that he aimed to popularize Plotinus' teaching. In a chapter focused on Porphyry's work as an educator, Johnson clarifies that the philosopher wrote with students in mind, but not for a popular audience. His introductions to philosophical texts went on to be key in later Latin, Greek and Arabic philosophical circles. He wrote about topics such as astrology in order to sort out the "hidden truths" in problematic practices, as part of his guidance for a small intellectual elite (185).

The second half of the book turns to Porphyry's discussion of different ethnic groups and their philosophical and religious teachings. The first chapter in this section addresses Porphyry's "ethnic argumentation," his use of examples from other cultures to support his points about philosophy. For instance, when Porphyry argues that caves represented the material world in Homer as well as Plato, he confirms this by citing similar Persian religious beliefs and practices. The variations among different cultures did not pose a problem for Porphyry's Platonic cosmology; instead, multiplicity is what a late antique Platonist would expect to find in the material world, at the opposite end of the spectrum from the One.

For Porphyry, different cultures could exhibit "local, particular embodiments of truth and so confirm and enrich one's vision of transcendent unity diffused throughout multiplicity" (201-2). Porphyry did not withdraw from the world around him; instead, he submitted it all to his philosophical system and used examples from various traditions to make his points. Johnson points out that Porphyry not only admired the traditions of other cultures, but even set them higher than the Greeks. He considered the Egyptians, Assyrians and Jews as especially pious nations. Unfortunately, his explanation of his reasons is not in the surviving corpus. In another case, Porphyry observes that barbarians found paths to the gods, but the Greeks were misled. Johnson points out that Porphyry was clearly not a defender of Hellenism. His view was that Platonic truth was universal, so perhaps it was not surprising to him that wise people elsewhere had some conception of it.

In the last two chapters, Johnson continues his study of Porphyry's ethnography and how this related to his conception of Hellenism. Johnson cites other thinkers, including two earlier Greco-Phoenicians, who made up a spectrum ranging from Hellenocentrism to a view that de-centered the Greeks and privileged "barbarian wisdom." In some cases, Greek language and paideia did not add up to complete "Hellenicity." In the case of Porphyry, he had both praise and blame for the Greeks, while also recognizing the faults and advancements of non-Greeks. Johnson describes this approach as "ethnic particularism," which ascribed both virtuous and immoral behavior to each group.

The different ethnicities were part of the "horizontal" end of the philosophical cosmos -- the bottom of the pyramid. For Porphyry, the customs of foreigners conveyed the "universal vision of truth mapped onto the world in variegated forms" (259). Johnson surveys Porphyry's observations about the good and bad of different nations, including the Egyptians, Persians, Chaldaeans, Syrians/Phoenicians, Jews, and Indians. He then addresses Porphyry's attitude toward civic service. Although civic virtues were recognized, political life was usually viewed as a hindrance to progress as a philosopher. Nevertheless, philosophers benefited from living in the cosmopolitan empire, which allowed them access to texts from other cultures. Johnson presents an epilogue surveying Porphyry's role as a key thinker for later philosophical schools in which his writings were "translated" into new contexts. This is followed by appendices with translations of select fragments.

Johnson frames both the book's parts in terms of "translation": "vertical translation" and "horizontal translation." Vertical translation refers to how Porphyry fit common religious beliefs and rituals into the hierarchical, late Platonic notion of the cosmos. Likewise, the variety of cultures and wisdom traditions could be seen as part of the "horizontal" zone, at the base of the pyramid far below the One. Johnson introduces his metaphor of "translation" in the introduction, while making it clear that Porphyry did not speak or write in more than one language. It is unclear why he could not write in terms of "contextualizing," "conceptualizing", or "interpreting" to convey the idea of a Platonist making sense of the world around him according to his philosophy. Johnson uses the translation metaphor in many different ways throughout the book. He writes, for example: of "translation as an act of particularism" (10), that ideas could be "disentangled by a translational process" (98), that thinkers engage in "complex translational maneuvers" (99), of "translational work" (129). The metaphor becomes especially strained when the translation of languages ("interlingual translation," 304) factors into the discussion. For instance, the Syrian philosopher Bardaisan, known for his acquaintance with Indian wise men, was "a translator of cultural knowledge from a foreign context into a Greek idiom, a Platonic framework, and even (potentially) into a Christian perspective" (209). But, Johnson points out, we do not know whether Bardaisan was a translator, whether official translators were present, or if his students translated conversations from Syriac to Greek. In another case, Porphyry is described as "presenting barbarian wisdom in the words of the barbarians themselves" (252). If the philosopher quotes verbatim from barbarian sources, is this translation? Or is the lack of translation of these ideas into a Greek framework a part of philosophical "horizontal translation"? In some cases, though, Johnson's newly coined phrases are helpful or even humorous. For example, in reaction to scholarship claiming that Porphyry lacked any sort of Phoenician identity, Johnson claims they are throwing out the "Phoenician baby with the Orientalizing bathwater" (243). Later, "Hellenocritical" appears as a clever counterpoint to Hellenocentric (260).

Johnson's main points about Porphyry, however, are so convincing that the reader is left wondering how earlier scholars could have considered him to be an inconsistent thinker, a defender of paganism, a popularizer of philosophy, and an instigator of the Great Persecution of Christians. Both parts of the book demonstrate the coherence of Porphyry's work and set straight the various misconceptions about it. But only the second part of the book addresses ideas about Hellenism and ethnicity. As a result, the two halves do not fit together perfectly, despite the neatness of conceptualizing the two parts as vertical translation followed by horizontal translation. Anyone interested in Porphyry and his reception should read this book in its entirety. The second part of the book will be important for those interested in philosophical ideas about ethnicity and identity. Finally, Johnson should be commended for examining how philosophical texts fit into their broader cultural, intellectual and social milieus: his book expands our knowledge of how ancient philosophers and their ideas fit into the broader world around them.