Religion and Rationality: Essays on Reason, God, and Modernity

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Habermas, Jurgen, Religion and Rationality: Essays on Reason, God, and Modernity, edited by Eduardo Mendieta, MIT Press, 2002, 176 pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0262582163.

Reviewed by Fred Dallmayr, University of Notre Dame


This is a time to take stock, especially for intellectuals on the (traditional) Left. The end of the Cold War and the demise of the Soviet Union have brought to the fore two major conflicting tendencies: on the one hand, the upsurge of religious faith in many parts of the world, sometimes in the guise of a dogmatic fundamentalism; on the other hand, the triumphant rise of liberalism—now in the form of capitalist neo-liberalism—as a corollary of globalization. These developments have a peculiar bearing on the Frankfurt School, which by now spans at least two generations. While many members of the first generation were sympathetic to religion (though not to any kind of dogmatism) in the form of a subdued Jewish messianism, the basic initial impulse of the School—as an “Institute of Social Research”—was the critical analysis of late capitalism and bourgeois-liberal society. These tendencies were nearly reversed during the second generation. Under the guidance of Jürgen Habermas, “critical theory” showed little or no interest in religious faith, preferring instead to champion a purely rational discourse (inspired in part by neo-Kantianism and linguistic philosophy). At the same time, again under Habermas’s influence, critical theory has steadily moved closer to political liberalism, to the point that the distinction from Rawlsian proceduralism sometimes appears as a mere nuance. Small wonder that many observers have detected a gulf separating the two generations. Eduardo Mendieta, the editor of this collection, seeks to counteract and correct this perception. In his view (p.2, p.12), the second generation of the Frankfurt School has “without equivocation” continued the agenda of the first. With regard to religion, a central thesis of his introduction is that Habermas’s work “is not correctly characterized by the image of a temporal rupture between an early positive and a later negative appraisal of the role of religion.”

The essays collected in Religion and Rationality are meant to “constitute evidence” (p.14) of Mendieta’s claim of undisrupted continuity. As it happens, several of the selected essays date from the earlier period of Habermas’s career—prior to his full “linguistic turn” to discourse theory—when he was still relatively close to first generation thinkers; and while chapters taken from a later period—including a recent interview with Mendieta—mitigate the harsher connotations of “temporal rupture”, they can hardly be said to provide evidence of a smooth continuity. The impression of discontinuity is confirmed even by Mendieta’s own (otherwise informative) “Introduction” to the volume. Here one finds first of all a sensitive discussion of the religious leanings of the first generation, especially of its “Jewish utopian messianism”—in which Mendieta detects four main ingredients (p.4): restorative-anamnetic, utopian, apocalyptic, and messianic. Aspects of this outlook are illustrated in the writings of Bloch, Benjamin, Horkheimer, and Adorno. In the case of Horkheimer, reference is made (p.5, p.7) to his appeal to “an entirely Other (ein ganz Anderes),” his yearning for something “wholly other” and “absolutely unrepresentable” through which the injustices of history could be redeemed. Similar motifs are found in the writings of Adorno (p.8-9), especially in his treatment of the otherness of the Other as “irreplaceable and unrepresentable singularity,” and his refusal to accept “the assimilation of the singular into the concept” (without dismissing concepts as such). Mendieta also quotes Adorno’s statement: “If religion is accepted for the sake of something other than its own truth content, then it undermines itself,” and his addendum (in Negative Dialectics) that attempts to capture the Other immanently always put otherness “in jeopardy.” What was common to most first-generation thinkers was the assumption (p.11) that religion remains a reservoir “of humanity’s most deeply felt injustices and yearned for dreams of reconciliation.”

Seen against this background, the following discussion devoted to Habermas gives the impression of a sea-change—despite Mendieta’s assurance (p.11) that the notion of an anti-religious bias is “misleading.” Rather than explicating this assurance, the Introduction turns to Habermas’s pronounced social-scientific endeavors, especially his embrace of a mode of “functionalism” (inspired by Parsons and Luhmann) and his elaboration of evolutionary models of social and individual development. In large part, as Mendieta observes (p.14), these endeavors were prompted by “dissatisfaction” with the first generation’s treatment of rationality, and especially its refusal to take seriously Weber’s thesis of progressive societal “rationalization,” secularization and disenchantment. Borrowing from Weber and functionalists, Habermas at this point developed a comprehensive theory of social life, comprising “system” and “lifeworld” dimensions and moving through the stages of archaic, primitive, traditional, and modern societies. From a social-scientific vantage, religion fulfills basically an immanent societal “function” whose meaning changes over time. Habermas comes close to this view in his statement (p.18) that “the idea of God is transformed [aufgehoben] into the concept of a Logos that determines the community of believers and the real life-context of a self-emancipating society” and in the notion that “God is the name for the substance that gives coherence, unity, and thickness to the life-world.” Mendieta also elaborates on Habermas’s “linguistic turn,” especially his formulation of a “discourse morality” and a “universal pragmatics” of speech acts (totalizing all modes of linguistic interaction). Crucial in this context is the thesis of the progressive “linguistification of the sacred,” the latter seen as the “catalyst of modernity.” Religion at this point remains relevant (only) to the extent that it can be translated or assimilated into discursive language. Illustrative here are Habermas’s assertion (in The Theory of Communicative Action) that “the aura of rapture and terror that emanates from the sacred, the spellbinding power of the holy, is sublimated into the binding/bonding force of criticizable validity claims,” and his parallel statement that “only a morality, set communicatively aflow and developed into a discourse ethics, can replace the authority of the sacred” (p.24).

At the end of this overview, Mendieta reaffirms his conviction of continuity, stating (p.24) that, while “certainly a secularist,” Habermas is by no means an “anti-religion philosophe.” The point here, however, is not being for or against religion, but whether there are sufficient antennae to respect the difference, and respective integrity, of reason and faith, discursive validity and redemptive hope. In a functionalist (or quasi-functionalist) systems theory assigning a place or role to everything under the sun, where can there still be room for the “wholly other” and “absolutely unrepresentable” invoked by Horkheimer? Likewise, in a theory of universal pragmatics comprehending all possible speech acts, where can there still be room for any language beside that of discursive validity claims? Moreover, in a conception of linguistic intersubjectivity construed (with Mead) as “ego-alter-ego” relation, is there still a loophole left for the Other as “irreplaceable and unrepresentable singularity” in Adorno’s sense? As Mendieta points out (p.12), Habermas repeatedly acknowledges the debt owed by Enlightenment and modernity to the Judeo-Christian legacy. But this can be read as a simple developmental scheme. Here the “linguistification” thesis needs to be pondered. Does the thesis mean that, before discourse theory, religion or the sacred lacked language and was “speechless” (p.28)? But then how were its teachings transmitted? Or does the thesis mean that, in modernity, religion will be sublimated or absorbed without a remainder into discursive rationality? In this connection, how is one to read Habermas’s statement (in Postmetaphysical Thinking): “As long as no better words for what religion can say are found in the medium of rational discourse, it [communicative reason] will even coexist abstemiously with the former”? Does this leave to religion only the options of absorption (in rationality) or exclusion? Does faith always have to “accommodate itself” (p.150) and bend to modern reason, and never the other way around? But how does this respect their differential integrity? More specifically, given the fact that “universal” pragmatics is necessarily timeless, holding good at all times and places, how can it allow for the distinct temporality of salvation history and the redemptive hope for a messianic future animating the early Frankfurt School?

Limitations of space do not permit a detailed review of all the essays assembled in the volume. For present purposes, I restrict myself to a few brief comments. Readers interested in Jewish thought may find most appealing the first and the last of the selected essays, where Habermas displays his more sensitive-empathetic qualities. The first is titled “The German Idealism of the Jewish Philosophers” and ranges broadly (and insightfully) from Buber and Rosenzweig via Cohen and the Marburg School to Cassirer, Bloch, and Benjamin. The last deals with Habermas’s friend Gershom Scholem and his search for “the other of history in history” (a search focused on Isaak Luria, Sabbatai Sevi, and the kabbalistic tradition). As distinguished from this amicable treatment, the other chapters tend to accentuate more the tensional/conflictual nexus between reason and faith or Athens and Jerusalem. Thus, an essay “On the Difficulty of Saying No” illustrates, in Mendieta’s words (p.25), the “relationship between rationalization and mythological or religious world-views, in which the latter must submit to the transformative criticism enacted by the former.” Another chapter, “Transcendence from Within, Transcendence in this World”, goes back to a conference held in Chicago on “Habermas and Public Theology” (in 1988). There, responding to theologians and non-theologians, and defending “methodical atheism” as the only acceptable option for “postmetaphysical” philosophy, Habermas asserts among other things (p.76) that “whoever puts forth a truth claim today must, nevertheless, translate experiences that have their home in religious discourse into the language of a scientific expert culture” (or at least into the language of discourse theory). He also questions (p.81) whether the “superadditum” of religion is required if we “endeavor to act according to moral commands.” Another essay, “Israel or Athens”, deals with the Judeo-Christian theology of Johannes Baptist Metz, and especially with the latter’s notions of “anamnesis” and a “polycentric world church.” There, while appreciating some of Metz’s leanings, Habermas comes to the defense of Athens, arguing (p.133, p.136) that “profane reason must remain skeptical about the mystical causality of a recollection inspired by the history of salvation” and that “the idea of a polycentric church depends in turn on insights of the European Enlightenment and its political philosophy.”

Perhaps the distance separating Habermas from the first generation of Frankfurt thinkers is most clearly illustrated in an essay devoted to the work of Michael Theunissen, “Communicative Freedom and Negative Theology.” As it happens, Theunissen’s writings—under Christian auspices and with a focus on Hegel transformed by Kierkegaard—recapture in many ways the Jewish religious aspirations of that first generation. As Habermas acknowledges (p.113), Theunissen maintains trust in “an eschatological turning of the world” and tries to show philosophically “why profane hope must be anchored in eschatological hope.” To buttress this view, Theunissen transforms Hegelian subjectivity into a Kierkegaardian “unrepresentable singularity,” and Hegel’s lateral conception of intersubjectivity into a much more open-ended, vertical relation to radical otherness. In Habermas’s words (p.116), “he is convinced that every interpersonal relation is embedded in a relation to the radically Other, which precedes the relation to the concrete Other” and “embodies an absolute freedom”—a conception that “can be traced back to elements of Jewish and Protestant mysticism.” In this perspective, God as the “radically Other” is present in human history “in the form of a promise, the ‘anticipatory’ present of a fulfilled future” which alone can redeem human suffering and despair. Countering this outlook, Habermas brings to bear a battery of considerations: first of all the “anthropological fact” (p.122) of human self-maintenance (despite despair); and secondly the Kantian notion of . priori conditions of possibility (saying that “the mode of successfully being a self can only be employed in a hypothetical way in the transcendental clarification of its conditions of possibility”—on which basis “faith could only be justified in functional terms”). Finally, the essay chides Theunissen for ignoring the basic tenets of formal or universal pragmatics, which “all subjects must accept insofar as they orient their action towards validity claims at all” and which alone “can provide the normative basis for a critical theory of society” (p.118). Regarding Theunissen’s trust in “a transcendence irrupting into history” and his attempt to provide arguments supporting this trust, Habermas concludes (p.123): “I am unable to accept these reasons.”

My task here is not to arbitrate between Athens and Jerusalem or to judge the respective merits of rational-philosophical and religious-theological arguments. My point here was simply to cast doubt on Mendieta’s claim of a smooth, uninterrupted continuity between the two generations of the Frankfurt School. This doubt is further reinforced by developments in another arena for which Habermas has shown little sympathy: French philosophy, especially in its deconstructive variant. As it seems to me, many of the motifs of the first generation—appeals to eschatology and a “radically Other”—have resurfaced in recent decades in the writings of French Jewish and Christian thinkers, from Levinas to Derrida and Marion. Habermas’s essays make no reference to Levinas, and his comments on Derrida are almost uniformly dismissive. Have motifs of the first generation thus emigrated from Frankfurt into new terrains? Whatever the answer here may be, the concern is that other issues may likewise have traveled elsewhere. I mentioned at the beginning the progressive accommodation of “critical theory” to American liberalism—a trend acquiring ominous portents under the auspices of a globalized neo-liberalism. To Habermas’s credit, there are passages in Mendieta’s book showing awareness of these portents, as when, in the essay on Metz (p.30), he castigates “the barbaric reverse side of its own mirror” which Western Enlightenment has ignored for too long and which has encouraged the rise of “the stifling power of a capitalistic world civilization, which assimilates alien cultures and abandons its own traditions to oblivion.” However, in the later interview with Mendieta, we learn (p.153) that the current state of the world is really “without any clearly recogniziable alternative” and that “there is no reasonable exit-option left to us from a capitalist world society today.” Although deploring the “unjust distribution of good fortune in the world,” redress for this situation belongs for Habermas to politics and economics, “not in the cupboard of morality, let alone moral theory” (p.166). As he reiterates, the “burning issue of a just global order” is basically a “political” (that is, a tactical or strategic) problem, and “not a question for moral theory” or discourse ethics. Does this mean that the poor and marginalized populations of the Third and Fourth World can no loner expect intellectual and ethical support for their plight from Frankfurt? In this case, the rupture between the two generations would indeed seem unbridgeable.