Religion and the Obligations of Citizenship

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Weithman, Paul J., Religion and the Obligations of Citizenship, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 240pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 052180857X.

Reviewed by Lucas Swaine, Dartmouth College


Weithman opens this book declaring his interest in the nature and ethics of “responsible citizenship” (2-3). He asks what role churches play in preparing people to be citizens and ponders how religious believers can be good democratic citizens (ix, 11). From the outset, Weithman expresses his discontent with “standard” versions of public reason that stipulate a need to justify political or coercive arrangements “by reasons which are accessible to everyone” (6). Numerous liberals propose that citizens should rely upon accessible reasons in public debate, but the notion of accessibility is “hardly self-explanatory,” Weithman remarks (8, 9). He stands “deeply skeptical” of the criterion of accessibility for public reasons, and he claims, a fortiori, that an adequate conception of accessibility “cannot plausibly be spelled out” (9, 132).

Weithman first focuses on what he calls an ethics of political participation (13). He introduces the idea of “realized citizenship,” a standard that places psychological and affective criteria alongside a requirement of real opportunities for citizens (14). Realized citizenship is one element of “full participation,” Weithman avers (17). The concept of full participation is “widely held” in liberal democracies: it is the citizenship of “equals,” the “highest status” that can be conferred (20, 21). Full participants contribute to society, they partake of the goods they help to produce, and they are recognized as equal members in the enterprise (20). Full participation is conceptually “opposed” to minority of age, statelessness, disenfranchisement, and second-class citizenship (20). The exact standards of full participation are “politically contested,” as is the concept itself (31, 36, 93; cf. 69-70), but Weithman nevertheless asserts that such participation consists of “full and secure integration” into national life (29).

Within this range of contestation over full participation lie questions of exactly which rights and privileges should be afforded to citizens, and who should get them (36). Here Weithman emphasizes the role that religious institutions play in on-going political discussions. He proposes that religious institutions in America make “valuable contributions to democracy” (36, 91). Empirical evidence shows how churches provide opportunities to participate and engage in civic argument, and means through which people can “[achieve] the realization of citizenship” (48, 69, 85, 91). Not only did churches help to rid America of slavery: they continue to encourage participation among the poor and underprivileged, they contribute to civic argument and debate over important political questions, and churches prompt community involvement with opportunities for people to volunteer in various worthy capacities (4, 40-49, 90, 91). What is more, Weithman argues, the Biblical language employed by Catholic bishops or Martin Luther King, Jr. have had real “moral pay-off[s]”; such talk of sin and seemingly offensive admonishments shake people from complacency (53-54, 81). Catholic Church officials break the conservative stereotype: they may lobby against “partial-birth abortions,” embryo research, and physician-assisted suicide, but they also speak up for refugees, immigrants, and the poor (58, 60, 64). Nonetheless, debates on full participation and citizenship “should be settled by informed political debate”; and it is “important” that churches do not contest democratic institutions themselves (54, 62). The good news, Weithman suggests, is that American churches acknowledge the legitimacy of U.S. institutions. They teach reverence for American history, an appreciation of religious liberty among other democratic values, and that the country is worth dying for (63-64, 91).

With this in view, Weithman argues that people should reconsider the “expectations” they have of religious citizens: one needs to examine how those people are “brought to [their] convictions” (65). Since “only religious institutions” counterbalance political resources accruing in the hands of the financially and educationally advantaged, proponents of democracy broadly should “recognize and value” the contributions of churches (71, 73, 91). Religiously formed preferences are an “important counterweight” to private interest and prejudice, even under existing nonideal conditions (90).

But what of secondary institutions advocating undemocratic principles, illiberal ideals, or unjust laws (82)? Weithman agrees that some political outcomes are “incompatible” with liberal democracy; but from this it does not follow that such objectionable views should not be aired, or that religious citizens should be less involved in politics (83). First of all, various citizens hold “undemocratic” views on gun control, immigration, or the minimum wage; and few would suggest that those people should not be involved in politics (84). Second, it is not clear that church advocacy against late-term abortions or assisted suicide is anything less than a positive contribution to debates over full participation (84).

Weithman then focuses on voting and advocacy, proposing that responsible voting “requires voting for what one takes to be adequate reasons” (103). Advocating responsibly is also a “good thing,” irrespective of the size of the group to which one promotes some policy, procedure, or law (103, 108, 110-112). In public political debate, persons should advocate “as citizens addressing other citizens”; but Weithman realizes that decision-making is at times marked by people failing to participate in “legitimately expected” ways (107). People may speak off topic or raise “irrelevant” concerns—Weithman intimates that this is no small problem, where he asks what would happen if all citizens were persuaded by “bad reasons” (107, 110). He nevertheless concludes that political candidates, voters, and others “may” rely on exclusively religious reasons when it comes to political advocacy or voting, whether or not essential liberties are at stake (112-14, 116-17, 119). He elaborates two central principles:

(5.1) Citizens of a liberal democracy may base their votes on reasons drawn from their comprehensive moral views, including their religious views, without having other reasons that are sufficient for their vote – provided they sincerely believe that their government would be justified in adopting the measures they vote for.
(5.2) Citizens of a liberal democracy may offer arguments in public political debate which depend upon reasons drawn from their comprehensive moral views, including their religious views, without making them good by appeal to other arguments – provided they believe that their government would be justified in adopting the measures they favor and are prepared to indicate what they think would justify the adoption of the measures.

Weithman distinguishes voting from advocacy, noting that he imposes a higher standard on the latter (121). Advocacy is an exercise in “persuasion,” whereas voting is “usually secret” (126, 128). (5.1) does not require that citizens “be ready” to indicate why they voted how they did: one can vote “without having or being prepared to offer” accessible reasons for the action (121, 129). It may be an excellence of citizenship to be able to offer reasons for how one votes, Weithman reflects, but it is not a duty (129). Indeed, Weithman’s two principles impose “no … requirements” of having, or being prepared to offer, justifying reasons to others (131). One need only believe that the vote or the policy one advocates is justified; being sincere but mistaken is acceptable (131-32). (5.1) and (5.2) simply do not require accessible reasons or arguments of citizens, clearing the way for a “much more prominent role” for religion in political decision-making (132, 133).

For those worried about the prospects of people relying upon “exclusively” religious reasons, Weithman underscores the important impetus of churches to the political arguments and social movements in which American citizens engage (137). American churches adapted to fill a real need for political participation, and they remain the only institutions that ignite political interests for significant sectors of the population, mobilizing people politically and helping them to identify with their citizenship (138). It is too much to expect such persons not to have the religious views on citizenship that they hold; indeed, Weithman submits, requiring anything to the contrary will force those people to disengage from politics (138). Eliminating religious disagreements would come at inevitable costs: debates would be impoverished, and the poor and minorities would be left out (139, 140). That alternative is just “not feasible”—asking religious people not to rely on their religious reasons would mean a sort of “self-censorship,” or it could lead them to believe that the reasons they think they have, which are not accessible to others, are bad (141-42). If people may not participate “solely for” religious reasons, then some will have to withdraw from politics altogether (65, 138). One should “accept” that some citizens will participate in politics for religious reasons, Weithman proposes, just as some will offer religious arguments in advocating the policies and procedures they favor (92).

Weithman contrasts his view with Robert Audi’s, whose position he describes as relying upon the idea of “accessibility or intelligibility” in public reasons (148). He criticizes Audi’s principle of secular motivation, which requires adequate secular motivation for promoting a coercive policy or law. Weithman complains that Audi neglects those aspiring to a “religiously integrated existence” (152-55). Those people cannot treat the principle of secular motivation as one of civic virtue, since they would act without adequate secular reason even though Audi’s principle requires that citizens must want not to act without it (154-56). Nor does the principle of secular motivation take account of situations where one “[recognizes] a good reason but [is not] moved by it,” Weithman claims (159). As for Audi’s famous principle of secular rationale, Weithman comments that liberals remain preoccupied with the notion that restrictions on freedom must be justified to people (167-68). But liberals like Audi rely on unarticulated, problematic views of “adequate information,” “full rationality,” or accessibility (171, 192). Furthermore, Weithman charges, Audi’s principle of secular rationale simply does not show what is wrong with coercing people for publicly non-intelligible or non-comprehensible reasons (177-78). Weithman adds a final chapter on Rawls’s work on public reason, distinguishing Rawls’s view from Audi’s (189-90), and arguing that Catholic conceptions of the “common good” should count as part of what Rawls calls the “family of liberal political conceptions” (197). Different views of citizenship are as natural as different views of the good, Weithman maintains, and so one can reasonably disagree with Rawls’s view of citizenship (209, 210, 212). In the long run, liberal democracies will continue to feature deep but reasonable disagreement about what reasons and arguments citizens owe each other (212). There are “unlikely to be shared grounds” for liberal democracy, Weithman concludes, but that is no cause for political concern (216).

There is much to recommend this book. Weithman rightly emphasizes the important and worthwhile contributions of churches to American society and politics, and he does well to incorporate empirical analysis of political participation to bolster his case. But readers may wonder whether American religion is not more of a mixed bag than Weithman lets on. After all, liberal democracies are marked by substantial contingencies of theocrats and religious zealots who reject the very idea of “full participation” that Weithman describes. Weithman at one point acknowledges that “extreme forms of fundamentalism” exist in the world, but he merely contrasts fundamentalism with Catholic institutions and American religion generally (61 fn. 74, 64). If the idea of full participation is conceptually opposed to second-class citizenship, disenfranchisement, and violations of basic human rights (20, 132), then various groups in America will reject it. Consider, inter alia, Nation of Islam’s view of Jews or the Ku Klux Klan’s position on Catholics and Blacks in the not-so-distant past. Weithman takes no account of such groups where he claims that religiously inspired civil strife “seems extremely unlikely” in the United States (161). Nor does he speak to current citizen and government suspicion of Muslims; and so Weithman’s forecast of stability for the American political climate will leave readers cold.

Weithman’s principles are interesting and liable to spark debate. But they too are not without their problems. First, it is not clear exactly what (5.1) and (5.2) disallow. The principles certainly permit abortion rights to be pared back dramatically; indeed, (5.1) and (5.2) permit that one may vote against abortion rights or physician-assisted suicide “just because” one believes that one’s religious authority is reliable; and citizens may even advocate restrictive policies based on some watery understanding of natural law, with no need to add or offer complementary arguments or accessible reasons for the measures at stake (129-31). Weithman blushes when it comes to articulating the implications of this latter allowance (e.g., states outlawing homosexual behavior), but here one sees broader concerns with the parameters of the principles themselves. For quite apart from whether it should be considered acceptable for people to participate in the ways Weithman describes, (5.1) and (5.2) are sufficiently lax to allow religious parties to disavow any combination of rights and liberties, procedural fair play, full participation, and even democracy itself (62, 107).

Second, Weithman is unclear on how he intends (5.1) and (5.2) to operate. Surely the “may” in (5.1) and (5.2) does not indicate a mere formal free speech right: neither Audi nor Rawls proposes that people in public debate armed only with religious reasons should have their freedom of speech curtailed or their ability to vote hampered, and no liberal worth her salt would argue as much. Rather, the question is whether those who at best offer only religious reasons to φ may be criticized for so doing, or whether their contributions should count as admissible, especially when policies and laws directly restricting other people’s behavior are at stake. If Weithman means to stipulate that the kinds of religious voting or advocacy allowed under (5.1) and (5.2) entail no violation of citizens’ duties, more work will have to be done to make the view plausible.

Third, Weithman’s argument against accessible reasons is provocative but requires more elaboration. Interestingly, Weithman seems to think that some reasons are accessible: he cites considerations from public health, economic growth, even “the demands of basic human rights” as examples (132). Weithman contrasts these “clear cases” with religious reasons; but readers will ask why the nature of accessible reasons cannot be determined, if such reasons do in fact exist. Further, on the question of whether any religious reasons might enjoy accessibility, one suspects that some reasons from natural theology could meet the challenge. As for reasons which are not accessible, it is unclear why Weithman does not follow through on his thought that at least some such reasons are “bad” (100, 203). One is tempted to conclude that some putative reasons are not reasons at all; even if no adequate standard of accessible reasons were available to political philosophers, that would not imply that no such standard could be found for inaccessibility. Consider the frothing religious visionary claiming that God spoke to him in a dream, commanding Christians to kill American unbelievers. Are there no available criteria by which to determine that the putative reasons he adduces are inaccessible, bad, or not reasons at all?

Weithman seeks refuge against such criticisms in the garden of reasonableness and reasonable disagreement. He claims that “pervasive and reasonable” disagreement remains over a list of important issues: the nature of accessible or justifying reasons, specific institutional arrangements of liberal democracy, the kinds of reasons that justify government action, and reasons that citizens may rely on for voting and advocacy (132, 135, 136). Even if Weithman were correct on all counts, it would not be enough to justify or even recommend (5.1) and (5.2). For those two principles are darkly silent on reasonableness: they do not mention it, imply it, or require it of citizens who vote or advocate on controversial public matters. For that matter, Weithman conspicuously declines to consider the burdens of judgment or whether principles like (5.1) or (5.2) should require observance of them. Nor does Weithman directly take up the problem of whether the religious practitioner would be unreasonable simply to insist on the truth of his religious views when other reasonable people do not agree; Weithman talks of “undemocratically” held positions, but he nowhere identifies them as unreasonable (85-88). (5.1) and (5.2) just do not require reasonableness of citizens: and that puts Weithman’s very theory at risk of being unreasonable. For while he does not advance his arguments in an unreasonable manner, Weithman’s principles would permit voting or advocacy for unreasonable measures, in unreasonable ways, and on unreasonable grounds.

There is in a sense a kind of conflict in this book between Weithman and the principles he advocates. He rightly believes that it is natural and reasonable for a liberal democratic citizenry to be distinguished by a variety of reasonable views, and he aims to be sensitive to that fact. But it is not at all evident that citizens may legitimately participate in the ways Weithman allows, and readers may ultimately wonder what would be lost if greater demands were placed on religious citizens than Weithman’s principles require. For it is false that religious citizens mobilized by churches will be pushed back out of politics if their views or their reasons are questioned or criticized. Those citizens could rethink their views, participate in different ways, or simply back off of attempts to codify their nastier external preferences in law. Indeed, challenging the contributions of those relying on exclusively religious reasons not easily accessible to others can enliven and charge debate, prompting change in stagnant pools of religious and nonreligious comprehensive doctrines and conceptions of the good. It might even make for a more fruitful religiously integrated existence, God forbid. In the end, Weithman does well to visit mainstream American churches for guidance on responsible citizenship; but one must not return from the sojourn to whitewash the past, present, and future of American religious life.