Religion and the Sciences of Origins: Historical and Contemporary Discussions

Placeholder book cover

Kelly James Clark, Religion and the Sciences of Origins: Historical and Contemporary Discussions, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014, 274pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781137414809.

Reviewed by Karl Giberson, Stonehill College


Kelly James Clark’s book is a wide-ranging and well-informed survey of issues that animate the conversation between science and religion, largely as it is occurring within Christianity: Darwinian evolution, the Big Bang, free will, the mind-body problem, the nature of ethics, and the coherence and explanatory power of theism.

Clark writes with the informed sensitivity of an evangelical insider. But his writing displays little of the defensive and sometimes simplistic apologetics that plague so many science-and-religion books. Young earth creationism and intelligent design, for example, are both critiqued as the anti-scientific projects that they are. Science is celebrated as the “one of the most astounding of all human intellectual achievements,” (p. 21); the mountain of evidence for evolution is summarized; and various models for how God could create through an evolutionary process driven by seemingly random mutations are presented.

The author’s engaging style comes through in his discussion of this last topic. God could be a skilled “Riverboat Gambler” who would “know that human-like creatures would evolve” without knowing the details of how that was going to happen, in the midst of all the randomness involved in gambling, whether in poker or natural history. God could be a “Chess Master,” with a knowledge of all of nature’s possible “moves”: “God will know of every possibly contingency and be able to plan accordingly.” (p. 111) The “God as Santa Claus” model implants into evolved humans “the soul that makes them the individual persons they are.” (p. 112) Finally, the “God of the Philosophers” is outside time, creating history all at once, so nothing is actually random from God’s perspective. Clark’s restrained conclusion to these various options for reconciling a purposeful creation with an ambiguous and chance-driven evolutionary history is simply “If there is a God, then it’s possible that God created the world for a purpose.” (p. 114) Such restrained conclusions are a hallmark of the book, inviting readers into dialog, not arguments.

The early chapters cover familiar ground. The “conflict versus separation versus integration” models for relating science and religion are presented, with appropriate note of the fact that science and religion quarrel over a very limited number of issues. The urban legend that science and religion have been perennially at war is critiqued. Andrew Dixon White, the 19th century polemicist who did so much to create the now discredited “warfare metaphor,” is excoriated for his “combative and pugnacious language.” The role of Christian thinkers like Francis Bacon, Robert Boyle, and Isaac Newton in establishing science in Western Culture is noted. The Galileo Affair is demythologized as a 17th century battle between science and religion. The Scopes Trial is similarly dismantled as a 20th century repeat of the conflict between science and religion.

Not only is science compatible with religion, but also religion can help science, notes Clark, “by justifying the foundations or methodology of science, by courageously questioning brash and poorly established science, by warning science when it has exceeded its bounds, or by providing science with a moral conscience.” (p. 29)

The first few chapters are written in a way that makes them suitable for an introductory course. Clark shows his philosophical chops about halfway through the book, when he wades into the troubled waters of contemporary controversies. Having established that religion need not flee from science, he now raises the really interesting questions.

The central issue in science and religion today is whether science can explain everything. Are there things that religion is needed to explain or does religion not provide explanations? Having provided us with compelling and well-documented accounts of the history of the universe, our planet, life, and our own origins, ambitious and often anti-religious scientists are now pushing into increasingly speculative territory, attempting to explain away free will and human consciousness; to answer the age-old question “why is there something rather than nothing?”; to recast morality as a byproduct of evolution; to provide a naturalistic explanation for the human propensity to believe in God. The  scientistic goal is to make science the only way of knowing. This conflict is emerging as a major culture war as the overreach of science spawns reactionary pushbacks by religious believers. The widespread misperception that atheism and science are natural companions creates a receptive audience for religiously driven anti-science projects like young earth creationism, intelligent design, climate science denial, and even the anti-vaccination movement.

Clark quietly skewers the far-fetched claims of the culture warriors of scientism. Consider the so-called neurotheologians for whom religion is all in our heads. They have developed a “God helmet” that monitors brain activity during religious experiences, concluding that religious beliefs — “God-spasms” — are nothing but the product of “perfectly natural electromagnetic processes.” Leading philosopher and atheist Daniel Dennett infers that God is “nothing but an evolutionarily induced figment of our imagination.” (p. 117) Clark makes the obvious point that such results prove no such thing and, in fact, are often neutral on the very question they are addressing. The atheist can certainly claim that the God helmet results explain “why so many people believe in God.” But the theist can respond to the same results by saying “So that’s how God created us so that people would believe in him.” (p. 136)

Lawrence Krauss and other cosmologists are advancing the strange claim that science has figured out how to get “a universe from nothing.” Krauss, in a book subtitled Why There is Something Rather than Nothing, presents a relatively common argument being made by many scientists, despite its being breathtakingly naïve. Cosmologists have shown — this much is true — that the earliest known stage of our universe was probably a “quantum vacuum” and that our universe probably erupted out of this vacuum. Since this vacuum technically has no matter in it, Krauss says it is “empty” and labels it “nothing.” But the quantum vacuum is far from the nothing to which the phrase creation ex nihilo refers. Krauss goes so far as to define this “empty space” as a “boiling, bubbling brew of virtual particles and fields wildly fluctuating in magnitude” (p. 195), which most surely leaves his more philosophically sophisticated readers scratching their heads about why he would call this “nothing.”

Clark explores in some detail the argument that the laws of physics appear finely tuned to support life, noting the various explanations that have been provided. He makes the case for theism as the best explanation but acknowledges that one’s prior views of the plausibility of God’s existence probably determine how this argument will play out. The arguments “may,” he says, move one from “agnosticism to theism” or strengthen “already held theistic belief.” (p. 206)

Most of the conclusions are comfortably understated, and neatly summarized in a brief section that closes each chapter. Used as a classroom text, I could imagine a diversity of students arriving at these conclusions feeling like their perspectives were treated fairly, even when they were critiqued. (The exception would be biblical literalists, who are clearly not among the targeted readers.) The only conclusion that I felt was overstated came at the end of the chapter titled “God and the Good Life,” where Clark writes:

Belief in God is morally advantageous because it motivates rationally self-interested people to be moral. Moreover, only if there is a next life in which virtue is attainable and happiness expected can one be properly motivated to be moral. Belief in a superknower who exercises a kind of moral providence dramatically increases prosocial behavior. (p. 164)

But even here Clark pulls his punches a bit. He asks the reader to consider the possibility that “theism is roughly equal in explanatory power to naturalism.” If the answer is yes, then is it not possible that the “moral advantages of theism might tip the scales in favor of belief in God?” (p. 164)

The book ends with two chapters that seemed like they belonged in a different book: “Judaism and Evolution” and “Islam and Evolution.” This is perhaps understandable. Clark wears several professional hats, one of which is as a senior fellow at the Kaufman Interfaith Institute at Grand Valley State University in Michigan, where he works on interfaith dialog with Muslims, Christians, and Jews. These chapters bring the other monotheistic traditions into the conversation but in a way that is discontinuous with the rest of the book. We learn, for example, that the migration of modern science into Islam has often been attached to Western imperialism, accounting for its lack of progress. Or that 26 percent of all Nobel prizes have gone to Jews. The earlier chapters do far less of this sociology of science and religion. The conclusion gets lost at the end of the chapter on Islam. And, while the book is primarily a rich, restrained, and multi-faceted defense of theism as a worldview congenial to science, the actual conclusion is a plea for tolerance because “each and every person is worthy of all of the respect that we owe God himself.” (p. 243)

I would love to have seen a concluding chapter summarizing the articulate defense of theism that is clearly a major theme of the book. In places Clark hints at the way different sorts of arguments interact, as when he suggests that the moral advantages of theism might tip the scale in favor of theism as an explanation for the natural world. But, having made so many different arguments, he leaves it to the reader to see just how convincing the collective arguments may or may not be.

This is an excellent book in a field populated by too many simplistic and apologetic works. All too often science-and-religion books oversimplify the questions, and appear to be defending conclusions that are not really on the table. Complex mysteries resolve themselves into arguments for pre-ordained conclusions. Clark has made a readable and informed contribution to the science and religion conversation.