Religion and Violence: Philosophical Perspectives from Kant to Derrida

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De Vries, Hent, Religion and Violence: Philosophical Perspectives from Kant to Derrida, Johns Hopkins University Press, 2002, 496pp, $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 0801867681.

Reviewed by Kevin Hart, University of Notre Dame


In Religion and Violence, Hent de Vries continues the work he commenced in Philosophy and the Turn to Religion (Johns Hopkins UP, 1999). Once again, we find him re-reading the tradition of modern European philosophy from Kant to Derrida, and once again that reading is informed by and is deeply sympathetic to Derrida’s understanding of both philosophy and religion. The earlier study sought to grasp the contemporary ‘turn to religion’ in a dialectical manner: neither theological nor anthropological terms were to be used uncritically. Theology has never been able fully to explain and regulate religion, de Vries claims, and far less so now that religion impinges on our world ‘after and well beyond the most hegemonic of its manifestations’ (xiii). We cannot properly engage ‘recent debates concerning identity and self-determination, the modern nation-state and multiculturalism, liberal democracy and immigration, globalization and the emergence of new media, the virtualization of reality…’ (xi), we are told, unless we recognize that they emerge from and indirectly answer to religious traditions. Of particular interest to de Vries in this study are the ways in which religion and philosophy repeat acts of violence or diagnose violent acts. And so, among other things, he examines Kant on radical evil, Kierkegaard on Abraham’s binding of Isaac, Benjamin on ‘divine violence’, and Derrida on absolute hostility.

Throughout, de Vries brings to his chosen topic an impressive erudition and a refined intelligence. Neither the erudition nor the intelligence prevents him from making large claims far too quickly, however, and since the study rests on these claims they need to be mentioned right at the start. One of these bold assertions is that philosophical modernity ‘continues to respect the boundaries and limits once imposed by the tradition called the religious’ (211). One could write a book about it, he says, and having a little joke with Kant he suggests calling it Philosophy within the Boundaries of Mere Religion (211). Surely, though, many philosophers have reason to think that philosophy since Descartes has persistently sought to disentangle itself from religious assumptions and horizons. Are they mistaken? One might point out that Descartes relied heavily on Suárez’s metaphysics, the very system that underpins the duplex ordo of Counter-Reformation Catholicism; but it would need to be clearly demonstrated that Descartes transmitted the limits of Christian thought to the philosophers he has influenced. Perhaps de Vries would not agree with the first part of the preceding sentence, and doubtless he is not in the business of undertaking the project foreshadowed in the second part. Yet he needs to give historical support to his claim, and also needs to indicate, albeit briefly, in what ways, and to what extents, philosophers like Frege, Russell and Quine remain in fee to Christian dogma.

Another large claim that takes one’s breath away is folded into de Vries’s expression ‘mere religion’. Kant’s Die Religion innerhalb der Grenzen der blossen Vernunft (1793) is concerned to examine religion from one side, and one side only: that which falls within the boundaries of bare reason. When Kant’s title is translated Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, as it is in the Cambridge edition of his writings, the adjective ‘mere’ is intended to mean ‘pure or unmixed’. Now de Vries is devoted to showing that there is no ‘mere religion’ in this sense, for even were a religion to be what it says it is (i.e., the way to truth) it would be also a good deal more than that (i.e., a multiplicity of indirect cultural effects that, among other things, trouble any sharp distinction between the sacred and the secular). I have no argument with this. Yet in the context of the book as a whole it is impossible not to feel that the adjective ‘mere’ is used to disparage religion. Consider the opening declaration of the book: ‘Far from being over and done with, the religious tradition contains considerable semantic and symbolic potential, as well as systematic… resources that have yet to be mobilized to explore the most challenging theoretical issues in contemporary philosophy, social theory, and cultural analysis’ (xi). A moment’s reflection on this sentence tells us much about the chapters that follow it.

What jolts is the image of the implied reader who naively believes that ‘the religious tradition’ is ‘over and done with’ and who must be corrected because it is important to know the direct and indirect effects of the tradition in order to understand contemporary culture and thought. But what is this implied reader taken to believe? Certainly no one, least of all in the United States where the book is published, could seriously think that a great many people do not confess belief in Christianity or Islam or Judaism. Religion itself is not ‘over and done with’; for many, it is the most important dimension of their lives. Given there are different traditions, it is unclear what ‘the religious tradition’ means: a tradition of religious practices? An ensemble of Christian traditions? Since the accent falls on tradition, perhaps the claim is that the tradition has reached its limit: there is no further development to be expected in Christianity or Islam or Judaism (or any other confession practiced today). Is this claim true? Not in any empirical sense: development of doctrine continues to occur in Christianity, while the so-called ‘new religions’ worry many. And if the claim is more Hegelian than empirical, no argument is given in support of it at any point of the book. The reader of the opening page of the preface is bound to be perplexed if he or she is placed so sharply at odds with the implied reader. A little later a clearer image of the implied reader is given: like the author, he or she regards neither ‘unreflecting faith’ nor ‘onto-theology’ as ‘an option still available to “us”’ (xii). Now agnosticism and atheism are defensible positions, but the superior tone adopted here and elsewhere in the book is regrettable. More damaging to the book as a whole, though, is the narrowness of the options made available. Do all believers fall simply into either onto-theology or unreflective faith? By no means; and there are various contemporary philosophers and theologians who urge positions that are neither onto-theological nor based on unreflective faith: Louis-Marie Chauvet, Jean-Louis Chrétien, Eberhard Jüngel, Jean-Yves Lacoste, Jean-Luc Marion, Paul Ricoeur and Edward Schillebeeckx, for example.

That religion has direct and indirect cultural and intellectual effects that escape theological attention is a plausible claim, though only if one unduly restricts the range of ‘theology’. After all, theology multiplies itself just as philosophy does. One can readily find courses and conferences on the theology of culture, theology of the media, theology of society, theology and film, and so on. To regard theology as either ‘dogmatic or biblical’ (xi) as de Vries does is not to see it clearly and fairly. One of the serious gaps in the book is precisely the absence of any awareness of theological engagement, past or present, with violence. Recent work in the theology of sacrifice, including the Aqedah or binding of Isaac, is a case in point. Yet even if de Vries wishes not to engage with theology as such, it is curious that no mention is made, even in the bibliography, of works that bear more directly on his concerns, studies as different as John Milbank’s reflections on ‘ontological violence’ in his Theology and Social Theory (1993) and Regina Schwartz’s analysis of the relation of land and the violent heritage of monotheism in her The Curse of Cain (1997).

If one brackets the methodological and scholarly concerns I have just mentioned and focuses wholly on the readings of Kant and Kierkegaard, Benjamin and Derrida, then different reactions and concerns present themselves. De Vries writes smoothly, intelligently and informatively about all the thinkers who interest him. His sympathy with Derrida’s views on religion does not tie him to mechanical repetition of the master’s lessons, although the excursions he makes are along the lines one would expect from someone so close to Derrida. The very smoothness of the book is perhaps its most and least useful aspect. De Vries’s ease when dealing with intractably difficult authors commends Religion and Violence to students who wish to gain a better understanding of the philosophy of religion as practiced with respect to European authors. The ease is attained, however, by de Vries’ plotting a steady course between concepts and texts.

On the one hand, there is little attention given to the arguments philosophers have used to reach conclusions. Hardly any interest is shown in pondering counter-examples, in seeking alternate paths through an argument, in weighing assumptions and testing conclusions. Speed is the enemy of thought, here as elsewhere. For example, when explicating Derrida’s intriguing claim tout autre est tout autre (‘every other person is totally other’), it is surprising that an obvious objection — that the other and the self are analogically linked — is not even considered. On the other hand, there is insufficient interest shown in reading a philosophical passage closely: material is quoted, to be sure, but with a view to providing evidence rather than uncovering what has been bypassed, overlooked or repressed. Perhaps the most important lesson that Derrida has to teach us is how to read philosophical and theological texts as slowly as one reads poems. Unfortunately, the lesson has seldom been learned well.