Religion as Make-Believe: A Theory of Belief, Imagination, and Group Identity

Religion as Make-Believe

Neil Van Leeuwen, Religion as Make-Believe, Harvard University Press, 2023, 312pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674290334.

Reviewed by Eric Schwitzgebel, University of California, Riverside


In Religion as Make-Believe, Neil Van Leeuwen argues that factual beliefs (for example, that there’s beer in the fridge) differ greatly from “religious credences” (for example, that God is a trinity). Although people commonly say they “believe” the central doctrines of their religion, their attitudes are often closer to pretense. Hence, religion as “make-believe”.

According to Van Leeuwen, if you factually believe that there is beer in the fridge, your attitude normally has four functional features:

(1) It is involuntary. You can’t help but believe that there’s beer in the fridge upon looking there and seeing beer.

(2) It is vulnerable to evidence. If you later look in the fridge and discover no beer, your belief will vanish.

(3) It guides actions across the board. If the question of whether beer is in the fridge becomes relevant, you will tend to act in light of that belief.

(4) It provides the informational background governing other attitudes. For example, if you imagine a beer-loving guest opening the fridge, you will imagine them noticing the beer.

Religious credences, as Van Leeuwen characterizes them, have none of these features. If you “religiously creed” that God is a trinity, that attitude is:

(1) Voluntary. In some sense, you choose to have this religious credence.

(2) Invulnerable to evidence. Factual evidence, for example, scientific evidence concerning the origin of the universe, will not normally cause the credence to disappear.

(3) Guides actions only in limited contexts. Outside of specifically religious contexts, the credence has little influence on behavior.

(4) Doesn’t reliably govern other attitudes. You will not, for example, alter your understanding of logic in light of the trinity paradox.

Although some people may factually believe some religious doctrines, Van Leeuwen holds that commonly what religious people say they believe they instead religiously creed.

Van Leeuwen describes his view as a “two map” view. Many religious people have one picture of the world – one map – concerning what they factually believe, and a different picture of the world – a different map – concerning what they religiously creed. These maps can conflict. Someone might factually believe that Earth is billions of years old and religiously creed that it is under a million years old. Such conflict needn’t be irrational, since the attitudes differ. Compare: You might believe that Earth is billions of years old but imagine, desire, or assume for the sake of argument that it is under a million years old. We draw different pictures for different purposes. On Van Leeuwen’s view, the same holds for religious credence.

Why do we have religious credences, if they are so tenuously connected to evidence? Van Leeuwen suggests that religious credences function to support group identities: They guide symbolic actions (for example, ritual behaviors) that signal group allegiance; and by professing “belief” in religious doctrines, people indicate and partly constitute their membership in a social group. Notably, the second function is best served if the religious credence is not well supported by factual evidence. If factual evidence compelled everyone to believe that God is a trinity, endorsement of that proposition would not distinguish group members from others. “Sacred” acts and values work similarly: Treating something as inviolable often works as a criterion of inclusion in a group identity. However, religious people typically factually recognize that sacred objects are ordinary mundane objects (an edible wafer, a simple doll) and can readily shift to conceptualizing them as unimportant outside of the context of the symbolic action.

Van Leeuwen also presents empirical evidence for a distinction between “think” and “believe” in ordinary usage, arguing that people more commonly use “think” for factual beliefs and “believe” for religious credences. It’s more natural to say I think there’s beer in the fridge and I believe that God is a trinity than the reverse. Such usage differences appear not only in Indo-European languages (for example, glauben in German and creer in Spanish being aligned with religious credence) but also in unrelated languages such as Thai and Mandarin (p. 136-139).

Plausibly, some people have religious attitudes that match the functional profile of Van Leeuwen’s religious credence. They voluntarily choose those attitudes. Counterevidence doesn’t budge them – not because they deny the counterevidence, but because they don’t regard their religious doctrines as factual, much as a child knows that their pretend telephone is not in fact a telephone but instead really a banana. And their attitudes are segregated from practical action and reasoning outside of religious contexts. At a Passover Seder, perhaps, they affirm their Jewish identity by choosing to say “God spared our firstborn sons” – but outside of temple they readily accept, perhaps even insist, that such stories are historically false. Van Leeuwen clearly articulates how such religious cognition differs from ordinary factual belief, neatly explaining several features of it, such as why factually unsupported propositions often play a central role. Belief theorists across a wide range of theoretical viewpoints can generally agree with Van Leeuwen that in such cases the affirmed religious proposition is not really “believed” (in the sense of “belief” standard in recent Anglophone philosophy).

However, also plausibly, as Van Leeuwen explicitly acknowledges, some people factually believe, and don’t just religiously creed, some of the doctrines of their religion. These “true believers”, as we might call them, are guided by religious doctrine whenever the content is relevant. They include those doctrines in the cognitive background governing their other attitudes. And they feel rationally compelled to reject any apparent counterevidence – for example, some young-Earth creationists who reject mainstream science. Their one map of the structure of the world builds God’s creation right into it, and anything that conflicts must be rejected. True believers’ religious doctrines are not a second, optional map, deployed when convenient in religious contexts and otherwise set aside.

The question then becomes: How typical is the first form of religious cognition? Van Leeuwen presents no systematic evidence concerning the proportion of religious make-believers to religious true believers. Still, Van Leeuwen invites the reader to regard make-believe as typical. For example, there’s the title: Religion as Make-Believe. This suggests a general account of religion as it typically occurs. He portrays evangelical Christians in the United States as typically having make-believe religious credence, not factual belief, in doctrines such as the effectiveness of petitionary prayer. We might accept religious make-believe in Van Leeuwen’s sense as a genuine phenomenon, which he has helpfully noticed and skillfully theorized, while wondering how common it is.

I conclude with three concerns.

(1) The distinction is too sharp. While Van Leeuwen allows the possibility of intermediate attitudes with some characteristics of factual belief and some characteristics of religious credence, he appears to regard intermediate cases as atypical. However, on an alternative and potentially empirically attractive view, big-picture attitudes typically have functional profiles somewhere between those that Van Leeuwen associates with factual belief and those he associates with religious credence.

Consider contents like: My teenage daughter has a great eye for fashion, or dispositionalism is the best approach to the metaphysics of belief, or all the races are intellectually equal. On a wide range of secular topics we care about, we ignore some counterevidence, tolerate some inconsistency, half-choose to allow ourselves to be or not to be convinced, and sometimes permit ourselves to deploy different ideas in different contexts. If religious attitudes also often inhabit this in-between space, being somewhat but not entirely voluntary, evidence-resistant, and divorced from mundane thought and action, then we have a smear of intermediate cases rather than two sharply distinguished attitude types.

(2) Van Leeuwen insufficiently attends to weak belief. A member of the Vineyard Christian movement claimed in religious contexts that a shock they experienced from their coffeemaker was a demonic attack, but also repaired their coffeemaker and described the shock in a more mundane way in non-religious contexts (p. 78-80). People who engage in petitionary prayer for healing typically also see doctors (p. 86-88). And people often confess doubt about their religion (p. 93-95, 124-125). Van Leeuwen leans heavily on such facts in making the case that people often don’t factually believe what they religiously endorse. Such observations are excellent evidence that the people don’t believe with 100% confidence that the demon shocked them, that the prayer will heal them, and that the central tenets of their religion are all true.

But such observations are virtually no evidence against the possibility of ordinary factual belief of perhaps 75% confidence that a demon shocked them, that prayer will heal, and that the central tenets are true. Alternative explanations, backup plans, and expressions of anxious doubt can be entirely appropriate and rational manifestations of low-confidence factual belief. On page 226, Van Leeuwen acknowledges and partly rebuts this “weak belief” explanation of religious attitudes, but the possibility doesn’t receive the attention it deserves earlier in the book. Much (though I agree, not all) of the waffling, double-mindedness, and situational variability in many people’s religious attitudes could be an ordinary reaction to uncertainty rather than signaling an attitude type other than factual belief. This undercuts an important element of his case for the distinction.

(3) If credence and belief are different attitude types, why do we feel rational pressure to reconcile their contents?[1] There is no rational conflict whatsoever between believing that Earth is billions of years old and imagining, desiring, or assuming for the sake of argument that Earth is under a million years old. We can construct conflicting maps for those different attitudes, feeling no rational pressure from their divergent contents. Believing P stands in no rational conflict with imagining not-P. But it doesn’t seem like most of us are, or should be, so easygoing about conflicts between religious attitudes and factual beliefs. Of course, some people are easygoing, such as the Passover Seder make-believer. However, I expect – and this is an empirical conjecture that could be tested with a careful application of Van Leeuwen’s framework – that most people, especially to the extent they say that they “believe” the doctrines of their religion, will reject conflicting factual content. They will say, for example, “Earth really is young. Mainstream science is wrong.” In other words, they feel the tension.

If so, most self-described believers don’t really have two attitudes types with conflicting content that needn’t be reconciled but instead one attitude type, representing Earth as either actually old or actually young. If they buy the science, they reinterpret the creation stories as myths or metaphors. If they insist that the creation stories are true, they reject the scientific consensus. What most people don’t appear to do is hold both the standard scientific view that Earth is literally old and simultaneously the religious view that Earth is literally young, with no felt tension. One or the other proposition will normally be treated as non-literal. Alternatively, someone might settle instead on a low-credence, intermediate, agnostic state. Note here the difference between modeling religious cognition through two factual beliefs with contents rendered non-conflicting (belief that P and belief that mythologically not-P) versus modeling it, as Van Leeuwen does, through different attitudes toward contradictory contents there is no rational pressure to reconcile (factual belief that P and religious credence that not-P). A one-attitude view nicely explains felt tension and the impulse to uncertainty or agnosticism. The tension is more difficult to explain on a two-attitude view.

Given its plausibility as an account of at least some religious cognition, Van Leeuwen’s Religion as Make-Believe constitutes a major achievement in the study of religious attitudes, which will and should shape discussion of religious belief for decades to come.

[1] I owe this objection in part to Thomas Kelly, who raised a version of it in a workshop discussion of Van Leeuwen’s work at Princeton in June 2022. See also my Splintered Mind blog post “The Overlapping Dispositional Profiles of Different Types of Belief” (Sep 12, 2022), Van Leeuwen’s guest post “The Rational Pressure Argument” (Oct 13, 2022), and my “Religious Believers Normally Do and Should Want Their Religious Credences to Align with Their Factual Beliefs” (Mar 14, 2024), all at