Religion in Human Evolution: From the Paleolithic to the Axial Age

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Robert N. Bellah, Religion in Human Evolution: From the Paleolithic to the Axial Age, Harvard University Press, 2011, 784pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674061439.

Reviewed by Steven Horst, Wesleyan University


Religion in Human Evolution is an impressive accomplishment. A massive (606 pages + 140 pages of notes) and densely written book, its narrative begins with the Big Bang and ends in the "Axial Age" (first millennium BCE).  The volume is the product of a lifetime of scholarly research completed in the author's 80s, drawing materials from history, sociology, anthropology, evolutionary biology and psychology, and the cognitive sciences. It is, in short, a book that is difficult to place into any single category, and impossible to render full justice in a review.

The first two chapters introduce, respectively, an understanding of religion and an overview of its relation to evolution. There are then chapters (3-5) on "tribal" and "Archaic" forms of religion, which prepare the way for the four central chapters, exploring the revolutionary changes in religion that took place around the world, almost simultaneously, in the middle of the first millennium BCE -- what Bellah calls the Axial Age -- and produced the beginnings of what we think of as the "great world religions" today. Each of these chapters contains a rich scholarly examination of the developments in one culture: ancient Israel, Classical Greece, China and India. The final chapter returns to more theoretical discussion, including some interesting notes on how Bellah might have changed some things had he known at the outset all that he had learned by the time the book was complete.

The main ideas of the book, however, are better served by a kind of reconstruction that does not follow the order of the chapters. I shall (with some trepidation, given the length and breadth of the book) attempt such a reconstruction, viewing Bellah as weaving together a story from three principal threads.

The first thread consists in presentation of the kinds of anthropological data and theory that have been the bread and butter of religious studies in recent decades: the work of field ethnographers, archaeologists, and historians, and the academic theories based upon them. The chapter (3) on tribal religion, while ultimately aimed at reconstructing the religion of Stone Age humans, necessarily relies upon ethnographic research on contemporary tribal societies to supply a model of ideas and practices lost in the prehistoric past. Examinations of "Archaic" societies (ancient Mesopotamia, Egypt, and Zhou China) and "Axial Age" civilizations of the mid-first millennium BCE (Israel, Greece, India, China) draw additionally upon textual studies. These elements, in some combination, figure in most prior attempts to provide a comprehensive account of religion, and indeed a good portion of the book could fruitfully be read as an opinionated survey of empirical and theoretical ideas in religious studies.

As religious studies is not among my areas of expertise, I shall not attempt to evaluate either the originality of Bellah's contributions in this area or the persuasiveness of his case for them. Other reviewers have emphasized the ways in which this book is in dialog with the works of previous great theorists of religion. Alan Wolfe [NYT, September 30, 2011] frames it as an extended response to Clifford Geertz's criticisms of a talk that Bellah presented in 1963, entitled "Religious Evolution". Richard Madsen notes the resonances with Weber, as well as important differences, and generously predicts that "in the next hundred years . . . the point of departure [for sociologists of religion] will be Robert Bellah rather than Weber."

Of course, the presence of the word 'evolution' in the title of the book, and the mention of the Paleolithic period in the subtitle, suggest that this cannot be solely a work in the history and sociology of religion, and indeed it is not. Chapter 2, "Religion and Evolution", covers a time period from the Big Bang until the Paleolithic era, and addresses scientific cosmogony, the history of living organisms on Earth, and some of the characteristic features of the mammalian, primate, and hominid lineages. It also introduces ideas by writers like Merlin Donald and Terrence Deacon, whose work defies disciplinary categorization, but might be described (albeit inelegantly) as "speculative cognitive paleoanthropology". The Paleolithic -- a period which covers over two million years, predating the appearance of Homo sapiens and encompassing the millennia over which we shared the planet with other human species -- is suitable ground for discussion of "evolution" in the original Darwinian sense of speciation through variation and natural selection.

But while Bellah is willing to make use of hypotheses about the deep "ancestral past", such as Merlin Donald's speculation that a pre-linguistic capacity for ritual may have been one of the primary evolutionary drivers of the capacity for language (135), for the most part he is concerned with how (presumably) recently-evolved traits, such as mimesis, ritual, language, and narrative, might help explain the uniquely human phenomena of religion. Of particular importance are his analysis of play (found in some form in all primate and indeed mammalian lineages) as a precursor to ritual, and three suggestions taken from Terrence Deacon and Tyrone Cashman. First, language, "involving a kind of fusion of episodic and procedural memory, necessarily gives rise to narrative. The emergence of narrative, based on language with its capacity for a synergistic union of the two earlier forms of memory, is central for religion." (102) Second, "the very nature of narrative could have led to ideas that life does not end with death." (102) And third, the capacity for symbolic representation allowed the basic emotions shared with other species to be transformed into more specialized emotions, "piety, awe, equanimity, self-transcendence, and spiritual renewal (to name a few)." (103, quoting Deacon and Cashman) Such speculations about the deep ancestral past make up the second thread of the narrative.

Most of the book, however, deals with cognitive, social, political and religious transformations that took place within the past 10,000 years, and the most important of them (the appearance of "Axial Age" cultures) in the first millennium BCE. This, of course, is a period too recent for explanation of species-typical traits as biological adaptations, and indeed the features of Axial Age cultures are far from species-typical. This raises questions of just what Bellah really means by "evolution". There is a long history of referring to any sort of cognitive or social change -- and particularly any involving novelty or interpreted as progress -- as "evolution". Neo-Darwinists would complain that such usage conflates a well-defined technical meaning in biology with a loose and nebulous popular meaning. It may be a relatively innocent conflation, so long as it is clear when one is talking about cognitive and cultural change and when one is talking about gene selection. But it becomes suspect when they are presented as a single phenomenon, and positively nefarious when a dubious social theory like Social Darwinism is draped in the mantle of evolutionary biology. Bellah certainly does not fall into the latter category, but some reviewers have taken him to task for conflating biological and social evolution.

Of course, evolutionary biology has moved beyond Neo-Darwinism; and some of the newer developments, such as phenotypic plasticity and niche selection, afford a broader notion of "evolution" that could accommodate cognitive and social change within a species. Unfortunately, however, Bellah misses the opportunity to use the resources of such notions in his account of the changes in religion in the Archaic and Axial Ages and the cognitive and social changes that went hand in hand with them. There is clearly a book to be written along these lines, and I expect that Bellah would be the first to welcome it, but Religion in Human Evolution is not that book.

What he does instead is to draw upon ideas from the aforementioned speculative cognitive paleoanthropologists, particularly Merlin Donald. The third strand of the book is thus the application of such ideas as an organizing framework for the cognitive, social, political and religious changes from tribal to Archaic and from Archaic to Axial cultures. It is, I fear, easy to lose hold of this strand in reading the middle chapters of the book. Indeed, I find it difficult to find much of it at all in the discussions of tribal and Archaic religion. But it reappears in the four chapters on the Axial Age and the concluding chapter. I think it unfortunate that Bellah does not bring this theoretical content together in one place, but I shall attempt to reconstruct it here:

  1. The human cultures we know of (at least up until the ending point of the book in the late 1st century BCE) may be grouped into three pure types: tribal, Archaic and Axial. (Though there are transitional cases as well.) There were, of course, forms of hominid life that must have lacked some of the characteristics of all known human cultures, which form a kind of baseline, but about these we can only speculate by comparing Homo sapiens with other present-day primates whose lineages diverged from our own at an even earlier date.
  2. These types of culture are each typified by a distinct configuration of cognitive and representational capacities, forms of governance, and religious practices (and at least in the later stages, beliefs).
  3. The three types are "progressive" in the sense that at each stage, new cognitive and representational abilities were added to the human toolkit, albeit without replacing the prior capacities.

For the stages of representational abilities, Bellah draws upon a typology derived in part from the work of Jerome Bruner. "In developing a typology of religious representations, we must start with the null category of unitive representations -- that is, representations that attempt to point to the unitive event or experience." (13, emphasis added) In addition to unitive representations, Bellah lists "enactive" representations (such as those enacted in ritual), symbolic representations (iconic, musical, poetical and narrative), and what he calls "conceptual" representations. This last label is potentially confusing, as symbolic representations presumably employ concepts. What seems to distinguish Bellah's "conceptual" representations is that they represent facts divorced from a standpoint. Conceptual representations, in this sense, are thus fundamental to both philosophy and the sciences. (Fans of Thomas Nagel's The View From Nowhere may doubt that there really is a way of thinking about the world that is truly without a standpoint, but I do not think that this was something that Bellah intended to contest.)

For stages of culture, he draws upon Merlin Donald's tripartite typology of human cultures: mimetic, mythic and theoretical. These, he points out, parallel the three types of religious representation (enactive, symbolic, and conceptual), and he suggests that Donald's "baseline stage", episodic culture, may have important relationships to unitive experience, as it is the kind of in-the-moment form of existence shared by non-human animals. (118)

If we connect the dots, the forms of representation that present themselves to the cognitive anthropologist can be seen as products of successive stages of cultural achievement, requiring changes in the cognitive toolkit available, at least some of which may also have been evolved capacities. On this view, "higher" kinds of representational abilities could be achieved only within a social group (even human children do not develop normal cognitive abilities if deprived of proper interactions with adults), and their original adaptive function may have been as much social as representational. Indeed, as many previous theorists have suggested, there may have been a prelinguistic ancestral group that possessed significant mimetic capacities (probably including vocalizations) used in communication and coordinated action, and the drive to expand these capacities may have been one of the important drivers of the development of more articulated languages. (Bellah seems inclined to dismiss the "language module" hypothesis in favor of the view that linguistic invariants are more a product of shared perceptual apparatus and environment, but it seems to me that the general story is independent of the view one takes on this question.)

One connection with religion here is that ritual is situated between mimesis and myth. Mimesis, borrowing a description from Donald, is "an increase in conscious control over action that involves four uniquely human abilities: mime, imitation, skill, and gesture. Mime, he [Donald] says, is the imaginative reenactment of an event." (125) Ritual is a type of mimesis, but there are other types, such as the kinds of operations needed to fashion an Acheulian stone axe, which require much practice and probably supervised instruction. Indeed, Donald views the shared attention of infant and parent as mimetic, and gesture as its ultimate communicative device. "Skill", as Donald uses the term, builds upon mimesis by adding "rehearsal, systematic improvement, and the chaining of mimetic acts into hierarchies." (125)

In Chapter 3, Bellah speculates that there may have been a pre-linguistic ancestral group that possessed ritual but not myth. But all contemporary human cultures possess both language and myth, though he makes a case that there are still some tribal cultures in which the relationship between them is tenuous. Tribal societies are small and relatively egalitarian -- in contemporary hunter-gatherer societies, the drive to dominance seems to be transformed into peaceful coexistence by the many cooperating to thwart any individual who attempts to dominate the others. And their rituals often set aside whatever type of political hierarchy exists in other spheres of their lives. Bellah writes that if "it is right to imagine mimetic ritual as straining to present an idea of society not as it is but as it ought to be, then Donald's notion that language emerged in an effort to attain a larger understanding of the world through myth makes a great deal of sense." (135) To paraphrase, at least one thing that mimetic ritual does is to create a shared idealized model of the participating community. It is, however, an enactive rather than a symbolic model. Making such implicit understanding explicit requires that it be re-expressed symbolically in language; and the larger and more complex the social group, the greater the cognitive pressure to do so. Myth is the symbolic product of the transposition of the kind of idealized global understanding of the community and its place in the world found in ritual.

This idealized model encompasses not only the social structure of the tribe, but also its (real and projected) relationship to the natural and supernatural world -- a contrast that would itself have little place in the worldview of tribal peoples. The rituals enact not only social relationships, but also relationships to ancestors and "powerful spirits", though Bellah stresses that the latter should not be thought of as "gods". The lines between living humans, ancestors, and powerful spirits are somewhat nebulous, and some tribal rituals seek to harness and direct the powers of the powerful spirits.

All of this stands in stark contrast to the social and religious profile of the large agricultural Archaic societies of Mesopotamia, Egypt, and Zhou China (each of which Bellah discusses at length), or of American societies such as the Maya and Inca. In all of these, there is the idea of a god-king -- a king who is the sole ritual mediator between his people and the gods, and may himself be viewed as divine or descended from a god. The role of such kings involves dual strands of dominance and nurturance. On the one hand, the king has absolute power over life and death, and human sacrifice is a common feature of such cultures. On the other hand, we also find widespread occurrence of such metaphors as the king as shepherd of his people. The consolidation of power in one person, along with a hierarchy of government, is mirrored in the organization of previously recognized "powerful spirits" into hierarchies under a high god and the construction of a mythological structure to support both the theology and the cultic-political status of the king.

It was not clear to me that Bellah was claiming that Archaic society involves a new kind of cognition, though clearly it involved the creation of new concepts of 'god' and 'king', a new sort of mythology involving stories of cosmology and creation, and a concentration of the sphere of ritual into the hands of the king and sometimes delegated to a priestly caste. Nor is it ultimately clear what Bellah wants to say about the distinctive cognitive, social, and religious features of Archaic societies beyond the fact that they are well accommodated to one another. Indeed, on pp. 261-263, he presents what look like three different accounts of the priority relationships among the features without adjudicating among the accounts or even acknowledging the tensions among them.

Axial culture, by contrast, is clearly typified by a new kind of cognition and a new type of discourse. Bellah writes, "It will be my argument that the axial breakthrough involved the emergence of theoretic culture in dialogue with mythic culture as a means for the 'comprehensive modeling of the entire human universe'." (272) What is necessary for "theoretical culture", however, is not merely the presence of theory -- accomplishments of the Archaic Age such as Babylonian astronomy involved theories of a sort. The full flower of Axial Age thought is found in a "theoretical attitude" which involves second-order thinking: that is, thinking about thinking. In Archaic cultures, it was not uncommon for one myth to be added to or to supplant another, but (with a few exceptions, like Akhenaten, discussed on pp. 276-8) this did not involve a declaration that the older myth was false. Bellah embraces Donald's view that theoretic culture is dependent upon two prior innovations: the invention of writing and its use for the external storage of memory. The presence of these, and of critical engagement with texts and social structures, qualifies ancient Israel as an Axial culture, even if only an "incipient" one, as it did not attain the kind of logical argumentation that the ancient Greeks did.

The theoretical attitude, however, did not replace prior modes of thinking, but added to them and ultimately transformed them:

Theoretic culture is added to mythic and mimetic culture -- which are reorganized in the process -- but they remain in their respective spheres indispensable. Theoretic culture is a remarkable achievement, but always a specialized one, usually involving written language in fields inaccessible to ordinary people. Everyday life continues to be lived in the face-to-face interaction of individuals and groups and in the patient activities of making a living in the physical world. It is first of all mimetic (enactive, to use Bruner's term) and not in need of verbal explanation, but if linguistic explanation is necessary, it will most often be narrative, not theoretic. (278)

Not only are what we think of as the "great world religions" today -- Judaism, Christianity, Islam, Buddhism (and, if one counts it as a religion, Confucianism) -- products of this Axial turn of thought.  Everything that arose from the innovations of classical Greece, including western philosophy and at least some components of western science, can trace their origins to Axial thought as well. Perhaps equally importantly, it is the wellspring of political criticism and reasoned persuasion.

But what about its effects on the main topic of the book, religion? One thing that unites Buddhism, Greek philosophy, and the Abrahamic religions is a movement towards transcendence: a deity (or an impersonal logos) above particular peoples and cultures to whom access need not be mediated by a king or priest, and standards of goodness, truth and justice to which our beliefs and practices are accountable through reasoned discourse. With this, there is a de-emphasis upon tribal gods, family ancestors, and the pivotal role of priests and kings. There is also (in those cases where a deity is still central to the system at all) a more absolute ontological divide between God and human beings, even if the relationships between them may be more direct.

The Axial revolutions, however, did not result in a characteristic new form of society that became the norm thereafter. Reasoned critique is a fragile skill in its own right, and it is even harder to bring it to the center of political or religious life. The great Axial innovators -- Jeremiah, Confucius, Buddha, Socrates, Plato (and a bit later, Jesus) -- were in some sense failures in their own time, at least if success is to be judged in terms of immediate political, social, moral or religious reform. The skill set developed in the Axial age, however, has continued to be central to subsequent cultural innovations, and those cultures that have been exposed to it have never been left untouched.

Clearly, Religion in Human Evolution is a very ambitious book. It is also a good read, accessible to people who do not have Ph.D.s. Indeed, I found myself most caught up in the parts of it about which I know the least, such as the historical and ethnographic accounts. Bellah's command of material spanning different disciplines, historical periods and parts of the world is nothing short of magisterial. However, as rich and thick as the book is, it is not nearly long enough to accommodate detailed argumentation about the many scholarly debates through which it treads. This is part of what makes the book readable beyond the small circle of people who are experts in all of the subjects on which it touches. But I suspect that many academicians will, like me, be least satisfied with the parts that involve their own disciplinary specialties.

In my own case, as a philosopher of mind who has recently taken interest in cognitive science of religion, my main frustration is that what strike me as the most important innovations in the book -- the attempts to bring cognitive and evolutionary approaches to the history of religion -- seem theoretically under-developed and only tenuously connected with the historical, textual, and ethnographic scholarship. I like and respect the work of Donald and Deacon, and I am happy to see it expanded upon in a book closer to mainstream conversations in religious studies. But the reader looking for theoretical and argumentative discussion of cognitivist and evolutionary theories themselves would do better to read Donald and Deacon than Bellah. It is not clear that Bellah adds any new contributions to their theories, and his explanations of how they relate to one another and to his descriptions of cultures could be more explicit. On the other hand, Bellah's book complements their work by providing far more discussion of religions, and hence stands a chance of being more than a mere curiosity to people in religious studies. Personally, I would have gladly sacrificed some of the cultural details for a more explicit discussion of how the theoretical ideas are supposed to apply to the remaining cases. But that is what one would expect from someone with my professional interests, and I do not wish this to become the kind of review that says merely, "I wish the author had written a different kind of book."

I am a bit more troubled by the absence of any mention of other kinds of work in cognitive science of religion, such as psychological theories about the origins of our ideas of supernatural beings or attempts to apply evolutionary explanations (such as costly signaling theory) to religious phenomena. Belief in supernatural beings, whether ancestors, "powerful spirits", national gods, or the God of Abraham, is an almost ubiquitous feature of the world's religions, and one that calls for explanation. And while Bellah provides a story about the transitions from powerful spirits to national gods to a transcendent God, the question of why people believe in any such beings, or the roles they play in the forms of life of different societies, are largely untouched in this book.

More generally, I was disappointed that, once empirical data and theoretical perspectives had been presented, there was little in the way of extended argumentative engagement with other positions or theoretical refinements. That is, it is precisely with respect to the fruits of the Axial age that I found the book weakest. But perhaps this is why Bellah returns, on several occasions, to the admonition that theories, in order to be told, must be transformed into narratives, and so any grand unifying account takes on something of the nature of myth. It is, I think, in just this quality -- the weaving together of many themes into a single narrative about religion in human history -- that the book's central strength lies.


Jerome Bruner, Studies in Cognitive Growth, New York, Wiley, 1966.

Terrence Deacon, The Symbolic Species: The Co-evolution of Language and the Brain, New York: Norton, 1997.

Terrence Deacon and Tyrone Cashman, "The Role of Symbolic Capacity in the Origin of Religion," Journal for the Study of Religion, Nature and Culture 3 (2009): 490-517.

Merlin Donald, Origins of the Modern Mind: Three Stages in the Evolution of Culture and Cognition, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1991.

Merlin Donald, A Mind So Rare: The Evolution of Human Consciousness, New York: Norton, 1999.

Madsen, Richard. "Weber for the 21st Century".

Wolf, Alan. "The Origins of Religion, Beginning with the Big Bang," New York Times Sunday Book Review, September 30, 2011.