Religion, Metaphysics, and the Postmodern: William Desmond and John D. Caputo

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Christopher Ben Simpson, Religion, Metaphysics, and the Postmodern: William Desmond and John D. Caputo, Indiana UP, 2009, 213pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253221247.

Reviewed by John McCarthy, Loyola University, Chicago



Christopher Ben Simpson identifies the very large horizon of the concerns addressed in his book, Religion, Metaphysics, and the Postmodern: William Desmond and John D. Caputo, early in the introduction:

The broad issue addressed is the state of religion and/or God-talk in the context of “postmodernity.” It attends to the question: how should we think of religion and God today? How now — in the context of recent continental (‘postmodern’) philosophy — God? Within the broad outlines of this question, I wish to address the more particular issue of the relationship between religion and metaphysics — and, secondarily, ethics (p. 1).

How Simpson “addresses” and “attends” to this large horizon is by placing the thought of two authors in relation to each other on the topics of metaphysics, ethics, and religion. John Caputo becomes the emblematic figure for “postmodern” (anti-metaphysical) thinking, and William Desmond becomes the emblematic figure for metaphysical/theistic thinking. The thesis argued regarding the relationship between the figures, and consequently, between the emblematic forms of thinking, “is that William Desmond’s approach to thinking about religion and God in relation to the domains of metaphysics and ethics provides a viable and preferable alternative to the like position represented in the work of John D. Caputo” (p. 3). The book, published by Indiana University Press in its series on Philosophy of Religion (series editor, Merold Westphal), is a very minimally revised Ph.D. thesis titled, Divine Hyperbolics: Desmond, Religion, Metaphysics and the Postmodern, completed in 2008 under the supervision of John Milbank at the University of Nottingham.

How we should think of religion and God today, or in any day, has proven to be an enduring, controversial issue for Western thought. The “today” location of this issue places the thinking at a particularly congested intersection of professional discourses: philosophy of religion, epistemology, critical theory, fundamental theology, neuro-theology, metaphysics, and phenomenology, to name a few. And at this congested intersection several discussions converge, some with quite a long history, others with a more recent vintage: the relation of faith/reason; how to describe “the modern” and its many adjectival children; the possibility of a philosophical apologetics for religion in an age of critical thought; the relation of “thinking” to “rationality”; the ubiquitous issues with language; and the relation of academic discourse about religion and God to religious life. To be sure, Simpson’s book addresses a large matrix of issues that are both important in the tradition of Western thought about religion and God and of current concern given the rapidly changing discourses involved in the discussion.

So the question then becomes, “Can and does the book achieve its goal through this strategy of juxtaposing the thought of Caputo and Desmond, the goal understood not only as the viability and preferability of Desmond’s metaphysical approach to philosophy of religion, ethics, and God, over that of Caputo, but also the viability and preferability of metaphysical theism over and against a postmodern radical hermeneutics?” This is not a book that can be understood as dealing only with the extensive corpus of two living philosophers, Desmond and Caputo; it is a book about a form of thinking appropriate to ethics, religion, and the understanding of God for contemporary Western Christian theism.

The structure of the book is clear. The six page introduction sets out the broad strategy of the argument and locates the discussion which pairs Caputo and Desmond against much larger backgrounds invoked through several contrasts: modern/postmodern; anti-metaphysical/metaphysical; Levinas and Nietzsche/Milbank and Pickstock; deconstruction/radical orthodoxy. The first chapter is a 16 page summary (with five pages of footnotes) of the work of Caputo on metaphysics, radical hermeneutics, and the consequent criticism of ethics and religion given this analysis of metaphysics. It ends with a short summary of what Caputo suggests as the form of post-metaphysical religion. Caputo’s position is labeled with the neologism, “LeviNietzchean,” to locate its roots in the late 19th and early 20th century turn away from German idealism and metaphysics, as well as its shift to heightened ethical responsibility and a more tragic/ambiguous sense of the origin of the “good” in human life.

The following three chapters (108 pages with 69 pages of footnotes) present a summary analysis of the work of Desmond on metaphysics (chapter 2), ethics (chapter 3), and God and religion (chapter 4). Each of these chapters takes the same form, namely a presentation of Desmond’s work, generally about two thirds of each chapter, followed by a critical comparison of Desmond’s work with that of Caputo. It argues for the “viability” of Desmond’s metaphysical theism by demonstrating how it escapes Caputo’s static conceptions of metaphysics, ethics, and religion; it argues for the “preferability” of Desmond’s position by demonstrating how it better addresses Caputo’s “motivating concerns” and generally “out-narrates” Caputo’s philosophy of religion.

The key to understanding why Caputo has got metaphysics wrong and why Desmond’s theistic metaphysics is viable is explained by Simpson’s rendition of Desmond’s metaxological metaphysics, a form of thinking about the entailments of being/good from being in the midst of living. It is a form of post-Hegelian metaphysics, less concerned with thought thinking itself in the ultimate certainty of the rational concept, and more concerned with an appreciative ethical and religious response within community to the giftedness of being. The argument is that this form of metaphysics is both logically coherent and able to represent the exigencies of valued living without reducing value to the activity of the autonomous subject. Fundamentally for Simpson metaphysics is alive and well — and necessary — on the other side of the failed attempts of various Enlightenment, critical, and deconstructionist attempts to bury it.

But more than being a viable form of thinking, Desmond’s metaphysical theism is preferable because it “out-narrates” a response to the contemporary concerns with ethics and religion that Caputo and Desmond share. The claim of “out-narrating” is more difficult to clarify than the argument about viability. What Simpson wants to demonstrate is the ability of Desmond’s position (and metaphysics as a whole) to include the LeviNietzschean anxieties, criticisms, and calls for responsibility (thus Caputo’s and much of postmodernity’s diagnosis about ethical and religious ambiguity is not all that wrong) but to “out-narrate” this position by shifting value from human action to “being” (thus providing a better foundation for ethics) and by understanding being as an agapic gift that calls for a response of gratitude (thus providing a better foundation for religion). Both of these claims to “out-narrate” are based on the sense that the modern fact/value distinction and the location of the “good” in the “individual” rather than in being are less satisfying as an account for why we as humans transcend autonomous individuality, positivism, objectivity, aimlessness, and all the other misdirections of modernity than a theistic metaphysics. Wanting to do good beyond the good for me as an individual “entails” or is better, more coherently narrated, via metaphysics where being and good are interchangeable. The same with religion: “religion as our being in relation to God, as our response to the gift of God, entails our recognition and appreciation of God’s gift and our becoming gift — giving ourselves” (p. 113).

So back to the central question: does the book achieve its goals through the strategy of juxtaposing the thought of Caputo and Desmond? If the goals were to be achieved the book would have to accomplish the following six tasks: 1) capture the positions of Caputo and Desmond fairly and equally on metaphysics, philosophy of religion, ethics, and God; 2) capture the difference between phenomenology/deconstruction and metaphysics fairly; 3) capture the distinction between modern and postmodern fairly and with sufficient nuance; 4) state clearly and argue what the criteria of “viability” and “preferability” are; 5) demonstrate that there is substantial (non-equivocal) conflict/opposition between the positions involved; 6) be sufficiently nuanced in the contextualization of the issues and the contemporary discourses involved with the metaphysical account of ethics and religion to address the larger horizon as well as the immediate writings of Caputo and Desmond. This is surely a tall order, a demanding roster of tasks set in motion by making Caputo and Desmond stand as emblematic for a very large and intricate matrix of issues. And because it sets its sights quite high, it almost inevitably must fall short.

Let me cite three important ways in which the book falls short, not in order to dismiss or minimize the work or thought that is evident in Simpson’s book, but more to see why it seems that many projects associated with Radical Orthodoxy require further thought.

First, I am not sure in the end that there is not a great deal more that Caputo and Desmond agree on in relation to ethics, religion, and God than they disagree on. Simpson recognizes this repeatedly throughout the text (e.g. pp. 52, 54, 56, 58, 61, 80, 127), which makes the strategy of “opposition” with the criterion of “being preferable” less helpful than getting at some of the real underlying issues, such as why metaphysics over phenomenology. Much of Desmond’s position is like that of Jean Luc Marion, but Marion steers away from onto-theological language for very clear reasons. Why, if there is so much agreement about the need of contemporary religion and ethics to reflect the uncertainties and ambiguities of life, to “be in the middle,” is metaphysical discourse and thinking more preferable than phenomenological discourse and thinking? This underlies the emblematic juxtaposition of Caputo and Desmond but is never adequately brought to the surface.

Second, why would we have to think that because there is a move or vector in thinking to the “good” as what draws us beyond any self satisfying good or self constitution, that there is this good or ground?

Metaphysics is inescapable as our mindfulness of the happening of life; it proceeds from our inherent exigency — from our need to think it — for all reflection is dependent on, and complicit in the question of the meaning of the “to be” that moves us to wonder and perplexity (p. 63).

This is where a theory of mind, largely avoided in this work, must come to bear on the central argument. Early in the chapter on metaphysics (chapter 2) the problem is evident in the definition of metaphysics: “metaphysics asks the question of being. It inquires into the meaning of being — the significance of ‘to be’” (p. 23). Being, meaning, and significance seem to collapse into each other. But surely meaning and significance as intentional demand some account of mind. That our mind “infers,” seeks causes, wants a giver for gifts, etc., does not establish a metaphysical referent for such causes, nor does it allow the inference to move into the category of “being.” It does allow us to say that this is the way human intending is structured, but unless being, meaning, and significance are so closely aligned, phenomenology, not metaphysics, may be as far as we can go.

Third, this leads to the important issue of axiology and testimony. In a telling footnote on page 152, Simpson speaks of the contrast between Desmond and Badiou. He writes:

In Desmond’s understanding, an infinite nature is not inconsistent with the existence of an infinite God. God need not be the erotic one that Badiou assumes. One suspects the difference here is, in part, one of theologies — of understandings of God — as much as of philosophies of nature or the infinite. Again, Badiou’s understanding is based on an axiomatic (militant) decision against God (as what Desmond would call the erotic origin, the absorbing God) and for the infinity of being. Desmond makes another axiomatic decision that includes an infinite God and an infinite world.

Throughout the argument of the book this issue of axiomatic decision is always at play but never adequately probed. How, when there is such agreement between Caputo and Desmond on the issues dealing with otherness, faithfulness to life, ambiguity and certainty, the call of another, the infinite, etc., does one give an account of the discourses to be used to understand our situation? Both Desmond and Caputo end up “testifying” about the “prayers and tears” of our lives, the need for God, and how that relates to ethics and religion. If the book were to truly probe the emblematic difference between Desmond and Caputo then something more akin to Ricoeur’s account of testimony on the other side of both Hegel and Nietzsche would be needed. In the end the question for this kind of philosophy of religion and ethics is not which position, Desmond’s or Caputo’s, is more viable or preferable, but rather, in Jean Nabert’s words, how to come to a “criteriology of the divine,” and how to articulate the testimony involved in such an task. If the decisions about the criteriology have already been made by Simpson,1 then philosophy of religion and ethics as metaphysics is not really being done from “the middle.”

Ultimately then, I would suggest that this book fails to achieve its goals, but how could it do otherwise? Contemporary philosophy of religion and contemporary fundamental theology are very complex and demanding, multidisciplinary endeavors. To “attend” to the question: “How should one think of religion and God today? How now — in the context of recent continental (‘postmodern’) philosophy — God?” involves much more thinking than what can be surfaced in the juxtaposition of Caputo and Desmond, and that is the challenge of a real philosophy of religion/ethics now.

1 and Desmond — indeed at one point Simpson observes, "Perhaps Desmond would benefit from a more positive account of revealed, confessional theology. Indeed, Desmond might need to “come out of the closet” as a theologian as well — to be able to give a more robust accounting (and so remedy a kind of incompleteness in his present accounting) of the indeed necessary relation between, not only philosophy and religion, but philosophy and theology. Such would only benefit philosophy and theology and the metaxological community between them" (p. 94).