Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason

Placeholder book cover

Immanuel Kant, Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason, Werner S. Pluhar (tr.), Stephen R. Palmquist (intro.), Hackett, 2009, 289pp., $16.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780872209763.

Reviewed by Anthony N. Perovich, Hope College



Selections from Kant’s Religion were first published in English translation as long ago as 1798, just a few years after the first edition appeared. A number of complete translations have followed, of which three are in print and easily available to the contemporary student: the Greene and Hudson translation of 1934 (Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone); the di Giovanni translation contained in the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant (Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason) from 1996, subsequently released in paperback along with some of Kant’s shorter writings on religious topics; and the translation under review (Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason). Werner Pluhar’s earlier translations for Hackett of Kant’s three Critiques have been positively received, and there is also much to admire in this new rendering of Kant’s most important work dealing with religion. Its value is enhanced by Pluhar’s retention (for the most part) of the English equivalents for Kant’s terminology that he introduced in those earlier translations, so that those who rely on his versions of the Critiques can now study the Religion in an edition consistent with them. The translation is based on the text appearing in volume six of the Akademie edition (Ak.) of Kant’s collected writings, whose page numbers are included in the margins. The volume also contains an introduction by Stephen R. Palmquist, a glossary of important terms along with their English renderings, an extensive bibliography, and an index for which the German equivalents of the English entries are included. (The Greene and Hudson has neither bibliography nor glossary; the paperback edition of di Giovanni, which is Pluhar’s most likely classroom competitor, contains a brief guide to further reading but no glossary, though one is found in the volume of the Cambridge Edition including Kant’s religious writings.)

Those who have followed the succession of Pluhar’s translations of Kant have noticed an increase in the number of notes he supplies to elucidate the text. His earliest translation, that of the Critique of Judgment (including the First Introduction), was well annotated, with several hundred notes. This new translation of the Religion, however, has perhaps four times as many notes for a text that takes up only a little more than half as many pages in the Akademie edition. Notes are placed at the foot of the page (not at the end, as with many of di Giovanni’s), although with this quantity of notes “foot” is not necessarily to be understood as “bottom”. Many of these notes are welcome indeed. Those that provide biographical information about figures mentioned by Kant are usually more informative than those found in Greene and Hudson or in di Giovanni. The appearance simply of the term salto mortale generates an informative explanatory note on Jacobi (di Giovanni includes a briefer but still helpful comment here as well). In at least one case Pluhar has identified the source of a quotation where his predecessors were unable to do so. Di Giovanni typically supplies more information than Greene and Hudson, but where di Giovanni has a quotation from an author in a note, Pluhar has the quotation in both the original as well as in translation; where di Giovanni has the original as well as a translation, Pluhar provides a lengthier version of the relevant text and translation.

One can get a sense of the relative thoroughness of the explanatory annotations from a few examples. At Ak. 27, Kant describes how the intention to allow no one to achieve superiority over us becomes transformed into an unjust desire to gain superiority over others. In Greene and Hudson the passage passes unnoted. In di Giovanni the reader is invited to compare Kant’s comments with Rousseau’s Emile, from which four lines are quoted in English translation. Pluhar quotes over seven lines in translation from Emile, including all of the passage cited by di Giovanni — the additional material does in fact help the reader appreciate Rousseau’s position — and precedes it with the original French. The situation is similar at Ak. 190, where Kant offers an apostrophe to sincerity, identifying it with Astraea, the goddess who lived among humans until their wickedness during the Iron Age led her to flee the earth. Again, Greene and Hudson provide no comment, while di Giovanni offers five relevant lines from Ovid’s Metamorphoses in translation. Pluhar gives seven lines from the Metamorphoses (including all the material in di Giovanni) in English, again preceded by the Latin. Pluhar also mentions (fairly) that the translation used by di Giovanni renders Astraea simply as “Justice”, and while di Giovanni helpfully explains that Astraea was often considered the goddess of justice, the reader is not informed that in the lines di Giovanni quotes “Justice” in fact translates Astraea. And so it goes: while explanatory annotations are not entirely absent in Greene and Hudson, they are relatively scarce (made up for in only a general way by the historical background in Greene’s introduction); they are more frequent in di Giovanni, and what is given there will be perfectly satisfactory for many English-speaking readers; with Pluhar, they are frequent, full, and make available a wealth of information relevant to understanding the text. Readers equipped to take advantage of the material offered by Pluhar will be very grateful.

Many of the notes, of course, identify the German word being translated. Pluhar explains that he is “a translator whose main goal is to enable the reader to see, as much as possible, what Kant actually said”, noting this in connection with a point about his translation of Sinnesänderung (74). Unlike Greene and Hudson as well as di Giovanni, who render Sinnesänderung as well as Herzensänderung as “change of heart”, Pluhar reserves this translation for the latter expression, marking the difference in Kant’s terms by offering “change of mentality” for the former. As is often the case here, Pluhar is willing to purchase a more accurate mirroring of the German text at the cost of some stiffness in the English rendering. This sort of thing happens frequently enough that one has to say that Pluhar does not read quite as smoothly as his competitors. Sometimes this is harmless, as when Pluhar preserves Kant’s definite article where one would normally omit it in English (“(The private prayer)” for (das Privatgebet) [Ak. 193]). Occasionally, however, staying too close to a literal reading misleads. For example, at Ak. 128 Kant writes of die Hypothese des Spiritualismus vernünftiger Weltwesen, wo der Körper todt in der Erde bleiben und doch dieselbe Person lebend da sein … kann. Di Giovanni renders this fluently as “the hypothesis of the spirituality of the rational beings of this world, according to which the body can remain dead on earth and yet the same person still be living.” Pluhar, however, translates this passage as follows: “the hypothesis of the spiritualism of rational beings of the world, where the body can remain dead in the earth and yet the same person still be there alive.” In numerous ways Pluhar remains closer to the German here, but in one case, namely, translating da sein as “be there”, the literalness actually confuses the meaning, making the reader wonder whether the person is perhaps alive somewhere in the earth.

And while it is perhaps churlish to take to task so conscientious an annotator as Pluhar, he can sometimes seem excessive: there is no reason, for example, to employ a footnote to inform us that the more literal equivalent of zum immer Besseren, rendered by “to the better and better”, is “to the ever better”, yet we have one and others like it. Pluhar’s translations of Willkür and willkürlich display an admirable commitment to consistency in the rendering of key terms, but there is occasionally a price to be paid in how idiomatically the translation reads. Willkür is rendered as “choice” or “power of choice” and willkürlich typically as “by choice”, “chosen”, or “matter of choice”. One of the advantages of including notes that identify the terms in the original language is that it frees the translator from the inevitably indefensible practice of rigidly translating a German term by a single English word. And Pluhar demonstrates his flexibility by at least once translating willkürlich as “contingent” (and noting “arbitrary” as an option in the footnote), but he does not perhaps do this often enough. When Kant states (Ak. 168) that “Only for the sake of a church, of which there can be different and equally good forms, can there be statutes, i.e., ordinances regarded as divine, which to our pure moral judging are chosen and contingent,” the reference to “different and equally good forms” seems to suggest that the translation of willkürlich as “arbitrary” would be more appropriate; the sense would seem to be better served (both Greene and Hudson and di Giovanni render it as “arbitrary”), and the footnote would remain to remind the reader that the term is the same as the one rendered “chosen” elsewhere. This is but one instance of an issue that is raised repeatedly.

Another source of the multitude of footnotes derives from Pluhar’s practice of regularly reminding readers of his decisions, unlike that of many translators who will explain certain choices at the outset and leave the matter there. For example, although he believes it to be important to translate Zweck consistently as “purpose” rather than “end”, to avoid the temporal connotations of the latter, and explains this early on, again and again notes call the reader’s attention to the fact that the word “purpose” in the text renders Zweck, which, Pluhar then states, could be alternatively translated as “end”. In this case and others, Pluhar comes across as the opposite of a translator who seeks to impose an interpretation on the reader. Even when rendering different German words by a single English word because he believes Kant to be using the German terms synonymously (moralisch/sittlich; Grundsatz/Prinzip; Gegenstand/Objekt), Pluhar is careful to let the reader know from the notes which term is being used by Kant in a particular case. Overall, between his translating decisions and his notes Pluhar manages to give a close English representation of Kant’s German, and this will be of prime importance for many readers, although it is achieved at some sacrifice in the fluency that, say, di Giovanni often attains.

Introductions to the three available editions vary greatly. In 1960, Greene and Hudson’s translation from 1934 reappeared in an edition that offered a revised text as well as a new introduction by John Silber on the ethical context of the Religion to supplement Theodore Greene’s introduction dealing with the religious context and the work’s significance. Silber’s introduction in particular contains helpful discussions of Kant’s terminology and moral theory. The introduction (by Robert Merrihew Adams) to the paperback edition of the di Giovanni translation is the shortest of the three, but it includes an illuminating discussion of Kant’s ideas in the light of his Reformation forebears. The introduction to Pluhar’s translation by Stephen R. Palmquist is less concerned with the philosophical analysis of Kant’s moral and religious ideas. It makes some attempt to place the work in the context of Kant’s life and of his critical philosophy, and in assessing its relevance it offers useful reminders against moral reductionism in the interpretation of the Religion. It is concerned above all, however, with summarizing Kant’s text. This is done largely through stitching together key phrases from the section under consideration; for example, Palmquist recounts Kant’s reflections on the incarnation as follows:

Kant says even if ‘a truly divinely minded human being’ were to appear in ‘outer experience’ as ‘a human being pleasing to God,’ no matter how great a ‘revolution in humankind’ his life and teachings brought about, we would not need ‘to assume in him anything other than a naturally begotten human being,’ because the archetype already has a divine origin (xxix-xxx).

No doubt this sort of retelling is useful for a certain type of reader, but it is not clear that it is the same reader who will benefit from Pluhar’s multilingual explanatory notes and his documentation of his every interpretive decision about how to render Kant’s terms.

As with Kant’s Grundlegung, each new translation of the Religion seems invariably to generate a new version of the title. In this case, there are both linguistic and philosophical grounds for using “bare reason” to render bloβen Vernunft. As Pluhar notes, “bare” captures the senses of both “mere” and “naked”, and Palmquist argues that the latter is important for preserving Kant’s clothing metaphor according to which the bare body of rational religion is clothed by some historical faith. There is one oddity in the relation between Pluhar and Palmquist that perhaps deserves notice: the reader is treated to the curious spectacle of the translator and the author of the introduction disagreeing, complete with dueling footnotes, over the rendering of one of Kant’s important terms, Gesinnung. The disagreement is in fact deep enough that Palmquist refuses to accept Pluhar’s rendering (“attitude”) in his introduction, choosing the traditional “disposition” (as in Greene and Hudson and in di Giovanni), though also making it clear that he favors “conviction” above all. Many readers will find that the footnotes in which each tries to justify his rendering illuminate more of Kant’s meaning than does the final translating choice each makes, for key terms in a philosophical text often need to be understood as placeholders for a complex conceptual construction that the introduction or the notes should provide.

Typographical errors are relatively rare and for the most part inconsequential. Except for those already noted by the publisher and slated for correction in future editions one might call attention only to page 180, where Pluhar has inserted em dashes improperly — there are none in the corresponding passage in Kant’s text — so that they fail to set off the intended parenthetical thought.

Whatever small reservations one might have, English-speaking readers will find in this translation of Kant’s Religion both a richly informative apparatus and an extraordinarily devoted attempt on the part of the Pluhar not only to explain his translation decisions but to provide readers, even those largely innocent of German, with the means for identifying where those decisions occur and for taking them into account in their own interpretation of the work. For the detailed study of Kant’s text in English, this is surely the most informative translation that we have, or are likely to see.