Religion Without God

Placeholder book cover

Ronald Dworkin, Religion Without God, Harvard University Press, 2013, 180pp., $17.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674726826.

Reviewed by Howard Wettstein, University of California, Riverside


Ronald Dworkin has left us a stimulating set of posthumously published reflections about religion. Such variations on religious themes have a long history. Something in Jewish-Christian-Islamic religiosity inspires generalization, or transplantation, or relocation to various metaphysical and even non-metaphysical locales. Dwelling in Psalms, one might experience a sense of depth, of contact with a profound human reality, one that need not be situated in the context of a god. God is -- the gods are -- powerful; metaphorically as well as, for the believer, in a more plain sense.

Dworkin speaks of religion without God. Spinoza, a somewhat kindred spirit, did it the other way around: God without religion. Religions are, after all, institutional arrangements; God might be appreciated, loved, or worshiped without such conformity. "God," though, suggests to Dworkin and many others (although not Spinoza) metaphysical commitment to a being, a supernatural person. Dworkin seeks not a god but spiritual seriousness, a commitment to core religious values including that of the moral life; and the appreciation for, gratefulness concerning, the awe-inspiring aspects of life. Dewey puts his similar project a bit differently: it is not religion we are after but rather the religious attitude.

"Religion," writes Dworkin, "holds that inherent, objective value permeates everything, that the universe and its creatures are awe-inspiring, that human life has purpose and the universe order." (p. 1) His emphasis on religious values seems right on point. If the religious attitude is to be transplanted to secular culture, the heart of it would seem to be attitudes/commitments to values: to love, to awe, to the ethical life. In a discussion of the problem of evil, Robert M. Adams once commented that evil presents an existential problem for any religious view. Adams, a committed theist, explained that by "religious view" he meant any view that makes awe and love central pillars of value.

Dworkin, however, goes further. It seems not enough to maintain such values, even as one's central commitments. The religious person takes such values to be "objective," "as real as trees or pain." (p. 10)

The religious attitude accepts the full, independent reality of value. It accepts the objective truth of two central judgments about value. The first holds that human life has objective meaning or importance. Each person has an innate and inescapable responsibility to try to make his life a successful one: that means living well, accepting ethical responsibilities to oneself as well as moral responsibilities to others . . . .The second holds that what we call 'nature' . . . is not just a matter of fact but is itself sublime: something of intrinsic value and wonder. (p. 10)

life's intrinsic meaning and nature's intrinsic beauty [are] paradigms of a fully religious attitude to life. (p. 11)

The enchantment [that William James attributes to religion] is the discovery of transcendental value in what otherwise seems transient and dead. (p. 12)

Trying to understand Dworkin's objectivity thesis makes the book intriguing and, for me, difficult. What is it to accept "the full independent reality of value"? Dworkin distinguishes two aspects of objective value: first, "to accept the objective truth . . . . that human life has objective meaning or importance." (p. 10) (forget/forgive the double "objective; the last one is enough for his purposes.) Another aspect of the reality of value for him is that nature is "not just a matter of fact but is itself sublime: . . . of intrinsic value and wonder." (p. 10) I will return to the two aspects of the objectivity of value.

Working through Dworkin's book has been a challenge, one that's not easy to explain. The book has the feel of a series of arguments that are only partly developed. Perhaps this is a matter of its being posthumous, based on his 2011 Einstein Lectures at the University of Bern.[1] Or perhaps these lectures were somewhat popular.

Here's an example of what I found so difficult. In a discussion of the autonomy of various disciplines Dworkin makes the point that "there is no finally noncircular way to certify our capacity to find truth of any kind in any intellectual domain." (p. 16) This is reasonable enough, but notice what he takes it to imply:

We find it impossible not to believe the elementary truths of mathematics and, when we understand them, the astonishingly complex truths that mathematicians have proved. But we cannot demonstrate either the elementary truths or the methods of mathematical demonstration from outside mathematics. We feel that we do not need any independent certification: we know we have an innate capacity for logic and mathematical truth. But how do we know we have that capacity? Only because we form beliefs in these domains that we simply cannot, however we try, disown. So we must have such a capacity. (pp. 16-17; italics added)

Dworkin is certainly right: we feel that we do not need independent certification of the methods of logic and mathematics. But once we ask how we know that we have the innate capacities in question, we raise the sort of fundamental question that requires real work. It's related to the work Wittgenstein displays in On Certainty. One cannot then simply say, as Dworkin does (or appears to), that we have such innate capacities follows from our inability to disown certain mathematical and logical beliefs. Perhaps I don't have Dworkin right here, but surely more needs to be said.

Understanding Dworkin's thought about religion is made difficult by his caricatured characterization of various opponent views. Here's what he says about naturalism:

The religious attitude rejects all forms of naturalism. . . . Some naturalists are nihilists: they say that values are only illusions. Other naturalists accept that in some sense values exist, but they define them so as to deny them any independent existence: they make them depend entirely on people's thoughts or reactions. (pp. 12-13)[2]

In "Chapter 2: The Universe,"[3] Dworkin turns from the religious values that "fill the lives of ordinary people" to "the religious value of celestial beauty that intoxicated Einstein" (p. 47). He makes the point that evolution and the

grand universe it has created is itself a source of beauty. This thought is not available to a naturalist. Only those parts of the universe that produce pleasure in our sight can be, for him, beautiful. He finds the universe as a whole an incalculably vast accident of gas and energy. Religion finds it, on the contrary, a deep complex order shining with beauty . . . . Theists find it obvious why the universe is sublime: it was created to be sublime. (p. 48)

Dworkin's naturalist denies -- why need she deny this? -- the existence of "a complex order shining with beauty," and his theist seems strangely logically inept.

In what follows I explore what I take to be at the heart of Dworkin's view of religion ( traditional and his own preferred religion without God):the objectivity thesis. Dworkin takes the objectivity of morality to be uncontroversially the view of the religious traditionalist. Is that so? I'll return below to the objective sublime, perhaps a more confusing business.

Once one has God as lawgiver, or so it might be thought, the objectivity of morality is guaranteed. I'm not sure this is so, nor sure that the objective-subjective distinction is the right tool, so to speak, for the job of getting at the heart of a religious position.

Consider the naturalistically-spirited idea that morality has evolved, developed over the course of pre-human and human history; and further that it is neither true nor false but rather more effective or less at securing human dignity, social coherence and perhaps other ends. Such a view might be accepted by a religious traditionalist; God's commands sanction and perhaps improve upon the evolved moral standards.

The evolved morality view seems a far cry from Dworkin's objective morality. At the same time, it's not an approach that renders morality subjective. Nor does the fact that it's evolved suggest that somehow the felt imperatives are less than categorical. The teleology of evolution aside, the agent's moral commitments are not conditional. One is committed.

Surely there is something objective about moral norms, even evolved ones. Their virtually universal intersubjectivity is more than impressive. And the old examples of Nazis and the like hardly show much of importance, other than human ugliness, frailty, and the inability to see ourselves, as it were, from the outside. And somewhat similarly -- to return briefly to the sublime -- there is enormous intersubjectivity about say, artistic excellence/beauty. I don't of course mean that everyone agrees about music. But we do give a great deal of weight to expert evaluation of music or visual art. This alone should give pause to any extreme subjectivity thesis. Which is not to say that experts, as all of us, don't vary in their tastes.

Still intersubjectivity is not, or not quite, objectivity. The undergraduate who still lurks somewhere in me wants to ask: Granted that we all agree (or even if we all agree), how does that make it objectively right?

The problem remains: how are we to understand Dworkin's objectivity, to be clear about what sort of out-there rightness is in question? One way, compatible with a great deal of what Dworkin says, is Moore's: in terms of non-natural moral properties. Moral judgments, then, become matters of (exotic) fact. But that seems a caricature of the real way in which morality is objective. And, such moves have well explored problems of their own.

If one reads Dworkin's book in isolation from the rest of his works, one will likely suppose, as I did early on, that he is endorsing some perhaps Moore-like metaphysical realism about morality and even aesthetics. However, this sort of metaphysical realism would represent a radical departure from his explicit positions elsewhere.[4]

Dworkin argues that ethics, along with domains like mathematics and physics, are autonomous; that one cannot ground our knowledge of such domains from outside the respective domains. Such disciplines, he sometimes says, rest on a kind of faith in our innate capacity to attain truth. (As we have seen, sometimes he relies on an argument for our innate capacity.) Beyond this, Dworkin does not pursue the nature of the truths affirmed, the nature of the objectivity that characterizes the truths of the domain.

Dworkin is surely right to see a religious person's commitment to ethics/morality as binding, and as central to religious life. I've often thought that part of the meaning of belief in God (the preposition matters, the topic is belief in and not belief that) is the idea that it really matters how I pursue my life. But why tie this to objectivity, to some sort of analogy with factual truths?

There is also the question of why make religious commitment -- traditional or Dworkin's -- dependent on the acceptance of a philosophical thesis, the objectivity of ethics/morality, the sense that our ethical values are as real as trees. Perhaps, despite the way he puts the matter again and again, he means to advance a more modest thesis, that "objectivity" best makes sense of the religious person's conviction that it really matters how one runs one's life. But for the reasons just given, it's hard to see why "objectivity" is the master key to such a philosophical explication.

Let's turn to the objective sublime. Awe and wonder are pillars of traditional religious life. When the Bible speaks of "fear of the Lord" as in the remark that it is "the beginning of wisdom," it's not mere fright that is envisaged. Indeed it's difficult to see how fright can be a central religious virtue. The Hebrew word, yirah, means both fear and awe and in many biblical contexts it's awe that's in question. (Of course, awe, in its more intense incarnations, can involve an admixture of fright.)

Turning from the Bible to religious life, awe is indeed near the heart of it. In my own Jewish religious tradition, one central practice is the making of blessings. Many occasions, many times a day, are occasions for blessings. There are different blessings for different foods, blessings upon seeing the ocean or a rainbow, upon study of the Torah, upon seeing a beautiful human being, or a scholar, even upon emerging from the bathroom. A. J. Heschel, a 20th century Jewish religious thinker, sees the blessing as both training in and expressions of awe. Before one sips water, or looks to the ocean or mountains, one takes a moment to reflect on the wonder. "The heavens declare the majesty of God," as the 19th Psalm has it. In the spirit of Heschel, one might see the saintly person as one who has internalized the habits of awe-appreciation, a person for whom the wonder constitutes a background condition for life, one that is often brought into the foreground.

If one envisages the possibility of religion without God, awe would naturally be central. But as with ethics, Dworkin insists on more than centrality.

To a naturalist [the beauty that we find in nature] is just a matter of our reactions to these sights: the pleasure we take in them. To the religious attitude they are discoveries of innate beauty: they are wonderful in themselves, not in virtue of how they strike us. (p. 45)

Wonder, like morality, surely has an objective aspect. There is, as mentioned above, the impressive intersubjectivity. There is also a worldly correlate to our judgments of beauty and awesomeness. Consider all the paintings a particular art connoisseur considers beautiful. It would no doubt be very interesting to see what objective features of things elicit from her such judgments of beauty. It is not a matter of what all these things have in common; no doubt the relations between the things have something more like a family resemblance. But still, there are objective features of things to which she is responding.

We could go further in the direction that I just set out, tracing the connoisseur's other judgments of beauty across the various art forms and eventually including natural objects. But however one does this and whatever the results, it's difficult to get a grip on Dworkin's idea that we are discussing things that are "wonderful in themselves, not in virtue of how they strike us." And again, Dworkin does not help with this question.

Dworkin is worried about subjectivism about morality, beauty, and the wondrous; he rejects various kinds of reductionism, for example one that sees moral and aesthetic judgments as reports of, or mere expressions of, our reactions. He insists that we are not thinking or talking about how things strike us, but about the ways that they are. And surely that's right. But there is still a difference between saying that something is, say, metallic and saying that it's wondrous, or for that matter, tasty. These concepts allude, so to speak, to human sensibility.

Stephen Mitchell, in his Introduction to his translation of the Book of Job (HarperCollins, 1987), writes, "When I was a very young Zen student, caught up in the problem of evil, I once asked my teacher, 'Why does shit smell so bad?' He said, 'If you were a fly, it would taste like candy.'" When we imagine, perhaps fantastically, other creatures' aesthetic judgments, is our view that they either agree with us or are just wrong about it? And when there is disagreement among art connoisseurs, is it the case that one and only one can be correct?

In this review I have focused upon what I take to be most striking and controversial in Dworkin's thought about religion. The questions raised do not suggest a problem with the idea of religion without God, an idea that I find of great interest. Considering religion without God may also direct attention to the roles that God plays in religious thought and religious life, roles that deserve more attention than they often get.

[1] A "Publisher’s Note" includes this remark: "[Dworkin] planned to greatly extend his treatment of the subject . . . but he became ill . . . and had time only to complete some revisions."

[2] Dworkin takes naturalism to be the view that "nothing is real except what can be studied by the natural sciences, including psychology." (p. 12)

[3] There are two additional chapters. Chapter 3 is concerned with the special rights people have to religious freedom. And the fourth and concluding chapter is a ten-page reflection on death and immortality.

[4] See, for example, Justice for Hedgehogs. This point was forcefully made to me by several friends much more familiar with Dworkin’s work than I am. Thanks especially to Melis Erdur and Jeff Helmreich, not only for this, but more generally for discussion of Dworkin’s views and remarks on an earlier draft.