Religions, Reasons and Gods: Essays in Cross-Cultural Philosophy of Religion

Placeholder book cover

John Clayton, Religions, Reasons and Gods: Essays in Cross-Cultural Philosophy of Religion, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 372pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521421047.

Reviewed by Charles Taliaferro, St. Olaf College


Religions, Reasons and Gods is a wonderful collection of interconnected essays by one of the most erudite contributors to the debate on religious pluralism.  While less well known than John Hick, Clayton deserves greater attention for both his general recommendations for future philosophy of religion and religious studies, as well as for his specific, searching insights about the history of philosophical reflection on religion.  Clayton, who served as the chair of the Department of Religious Studies at Lancaster University and then for five years as the chair of the Department of Religion at Boston University, died of cancer in 2003.  At Boston University, he was also Director of the Graduate Division of Religious and Theological Studies.  His death -- like the recent deaths of two other outstanding philosophers who addressed religious pluralism, Philip L. Quinn and Ninian Smart -- is a tragic loss.  Anne M. Blackburn and Thomas D. Carroll deserve our gratitude for their assembly and editing of this volume.  Many of the essays have been previously published, but many have not, including the text of Clayton's 1992 Stanton Lectures at Cambridge University.

Chapter one, "Claims, Contexts, and Contestability," rightly highlights what may be called the virtues of inquiry, including "the practice of empathy: namely, the imaginative participation of the observer in the spiritual and cognitive world of the religious tradition under scrutiny" (2).  Clayton urges us to spend more time with questions like "What would it be for such-and-such claim to be true?" and "What would count as reasons for holding such-and-such claim to be true?" (3).  This chapter should be widely anthologized in every philosophy of religion text.  Clayton forswears a general theory of rational inquiry, but what he does counsel is that we consider the full philosophical, social, religious, and cultural setting for philosophical exchanges.  While he offers several examples of this in the opening chapter, more detailed analysis comes later.

Chapter two, "Thomas Jefferson and the Study of Religion," takes on the role of religious belief in American culture, using examples from Hindu and Buddhist historical sources.  Jefferson is presented as an at least nominally Anglican intellectual with serious Unitarian learning. 

In this chapter and elsewhere, Clayton identifies three different "projects."  He calls these the "Enlightenment project" and the "Jefferson project," and I will entitle the third the "Clayton project."  He describes the first as follows:

The 'Enlightenment project' in its most general form is an attempt to identify and to justify without recourse to outside authority or private passion but by the exercise of reason and the limits of experience alone what we can truly know, what we ought rightly to do and what we may reasonably hope.  Rationality requires us in our deliberations to achieve neutrality by divesting ourselves of allegiance to any particular standpoint and to achieve universality by abstracting ourselves from all those communities of interest that may limit our perspective.  By this means were to be laid foundations on which to build with reasoned confidence. (21)

The "Jefferson project" is more specific to the practice of philosophy of religion:

In respect to philosophy of religion, that project can be regarded as the attempt to establish from a tradition-free, confessionally neutral starting-point logically sound and universally compelling reasons to accept the existence of God, the immorality of the soul and the authority of the moral law.  Built into the framework of the project is a distinction between 'natural religion', on the one hand, which was claimed to be universal in embrace, rational in character and benign in its consequences to the extent that it was thought to contribute to the stability of the social order and to unify the whole of human kind into what was then called, much too restrictively by out lights, 'the brotherhood of man'. (21)

In contrast to these, Clayton proposes that public rational discourse has and should allow for tradition-specific rational debate.  He (in my view, rightly) resists Wittgenstein-inspired attempts to derail metaphysical debate as well as John Hick's efforts to "solve" the challenge of religious pluralism by claiming that we are all, in the end, seeking the same thing.  Here is a wonderful passage defending the idea that diverse religious traditions make bona fide different, sometimes incompatible, claims:

Suppose a devout Buddhist monk, having been guided all his life by the precepts of the Visuddhimagga, finds that upon having reached the final jhana, he has in contrary to all expectations not passed 'beyond nothing whatever' to dwell in 'the attainment of neither perception nor non-perception', but has been treated instead to a vision of the love of the Triune God or of the Muslim heaven with all its physical delights or of 'the celestial city', of which John Hick wrote so fondly in an earlier incarnation.

Such a vision may be thought to be highly unlikely, if not culturally impossible.  But, for the sake of argument, let us assume that it did occur.  If so, it would not be recognized by a Theravadin as the goal.  It would more nearly be taken as a sign that something must have gone badly wrong.  'The Path of Purity' has efficacy if and only if it leads to precisely the goal toward which it is directed, that is, to the goal that is identified as such by Theravada. (33-34)

Having ruled out anti-realism and Hick's "The Real," Clayton demonstrates how public, philosophical debate occurs between religious traditions, requiring the participants to engage in what might be called internal and external inquiry.  Thus, a Hindu proponent of the Veda may (rightly) expect her or his interlocutor to consider the self-consistency or coherence of Vedic authority.  Taken alone, this would not count as a decisive blow to the Buddhist critique of Brahmanism, but it can be seen as part of an overall case for a form of Hinduism.  Clayton goes on to detail Udayana's challenge to Buddhist views of the self in order to exhibit how a public square can be a fruitful forum in which competing philosophical schools can grow in refinement and power.

Subsequent chapters fill out Clayton's reservations about the Enlightenment and Jefferson projects.  In "Common Ground and Defensible Difference," Clayton makes a plea for us to investigate more what distinguishes different religious and secular positions rather than what they have in common.

Common ground is not always unitive; it can be the cause of conflict.  Sometimes the greater the share in common ground, the more destructive the conflict.  It might be observed, at the risk of seeming overliteral, that no one has more common ground than do the Palestinians and the Israelis.  What they share in common is in fact the basis of their conflict.  Common ground, in short, does not always contribute to peace.  Nor, I would add, does radical difference necessarily give cause to worry about imminent culture wars at home or impending clashes of civilizations on the global scene.

Clarification of defensible difference, not identification of 'common ground', may be what is required to gain the co-operation of disparate religious interests in achieving pragmatically defined goals that enhance human flourishing.  This approach would entail a shift from focusing on reasons as grounds to focusing instead on reasons as motives and on reasons as goals; that is to say, focusing less on the grounds of argument and more on the ends of argument.  That, at least, is the possibility I want to put forward.  To get there, however, there is groundwork to be done. (59)

Clayton moves with ease offering critical observations on political liberalism in the Lockean tradition to offering insights on the Buddhist Nagasena, the Carvaka, Nyaya and Vaiseika, and more.  This is philosophy of religion at its best.  Clayton works up a sustained portrait of how religious beliefs are actually articulated and defended.

Chapter four continues the theme of locating theistic and non-theistic arguments in social contexts without falling into the black hole of philosophical oblivion as developed by D.Z. Phillips or John Caputo who both (for different reasons) seem to think that arguments found in the work of Richard Swinburne, for example, are religiously significant.  In fact, Clayton's work brilliantly demonstrates the systematic misreading of religion propounded by Phillips who seemed incapable of recognizing that theistic arguments have had, and continue to have, full blooded cognitive value (positive and negative) in the ordinary articulation, defense and criticism of religious convictions.

Chapter five is an extraordinary exercise in cross-cultural philosophy of religion, comparing Hume and Ramanuja.

The rest of the book looks at philosophical arguments, East and West, especially in early modern philosophy of religion.  Clayton summarizes his central thesis as follows:

My thesis concerning theistic arguments in the modern period is fairly straightforward: disembedded from their traditional contexts, in which they had served mainly tradition-specific ends, they were asked more and more to serve tradition-neutral ends by carrying the full load of justifying the rationality of basic religious claims.  This was a job for which they were ill equipped, and they eventually collapsed, surviving only when they did not serve the whims of this 'disembedded foundationalism'.  It is less surprising that they failed to do what they were not equipped to do than that they held up for as long as they did. How do we account for that? (245)

Whether you agree or disagree with the last statement, Clayton has done an excellent job helping us see the various classic and modern arguments making up canonical philosophy of religion in historical perspective.

I have only a few reservations.  There is a regrettable (in my view) caricature of Descartes.

Descartes is your worst nightmare as a neighbour.  No sooner has he bought the house next door than he begins worrying that it may be haunted.  Then one day he mutters that roofs have been known to leak and infers from this datum that his roof must be unreliable.  The next thing you know, he has the roof off and then begins to dismantle the place floor by floor, room by room, until he has the ground cleared.  Not content, he digs on until he hits bedrock.  With a worrying of Gallic self-satisfaction, he then proceeds to lay new foundations and to begin rebuilding his house.  You offer to help, but he refuses all assistance. (64)

Virtually everyone caricatures Descartes, so Clayton is not alone in this fairly stereotypical but very unhelpful portrait.  With Clayton's observations about Jefferson's flirtation with Unitarianism, it is surprising that he does not give some attention to Emerson and Thoreau.  Even more surprising is his omission of the Cambridge Platonists in his chapter "Early Modern British Philosophy" when it was they who propounded the first theistic arguments in English and coined so many of the terms that have currency in philosophy of religion today such as "theism."  The Cambridge Platonists would also have fully endorsed Clayton's concern with locating the practice of philosophy in a full social, especially political, forum.  They unapologetically brought their philosophical theology to bear in their case for tolerance in mid-seventeenth-century, war-torn Britain.  The omission of the Cambridge Platonists is ironic given that the last chapter is an address by Clayton delivered at Emmanuel College, Cambridge University, the academic home of Benjamin Whichcote, Ralph Cudworth, Nathaniel Culverwell, and John Smith who were (along with Henry More) the principal members of the Platonic movement at Cambridge.

So, Clayton has written a fine book about "the need for philosophers engaged in cross-cultural reflection to move beyond knowing that thinkers in diverse traditions hold certain views to a level of knowing how to engage their insights in the process of critical self reflection" (129).  How might philosophy of religion change if we accept the "Clayton project"?  What if the following depiction of theistic proofs is correct?

[T]heistic proofs exhibit clearly the religious 'forms of life' in the range of experiences which they express.  Their significance lies, not merely in their compatibility with specific doctrinal schemes, but also in their ability to express the range of religious experiences and the sorts of religious piety which are tolerated within the tradition of which they form a part.  Each of the traditional arguments for God's existence which have persisted in the West -- the ontological, the cosmological, the ideological and the moral proofs -- express the sorts of experience which have drawn people, not only to belief in what they took to be God, but also to worship of the deity.  This holds equally for proofs a priori and a posteriori, proofs from pure reason and from practical reason.  The ontological argument in at least its Anselmian form expresses a quiet but deep sense of awe before God as God; the various cosmological arguments express in different ways the sheer uncanniness that there should exist anything at all; the teleological arguments communicate that sense of wonder which can be evoked by even the most ordinary regularities of goal-directed tendencies exhibited in the world-order; the moral argument articulates that sense of oughtness which drives as if by divine imperative toward the highest good. (83)

If Clayton is correct, then it seems to me this broader contextual point of view might carry evidential weight insofar as it exhibits the coherence of theistic beliefs and it can serve a broader argument from religious experience, e.g. versions of that argument from either Gary Gutting or Richard Swinburne or Keith Yandell or Jerome Gellman or William Alston.

While this broader perspective is available, I assume most readers know at least one colleague for whom this perspective is utterly without any evidential interest.  One such colleague of mine is a hard determinist who believes that none of us are moral patients or agents.  He also believes that in all our experience as agents we have to assume that hard determinism is false (belief in libertarian freedom or at least not denying it is a prerequisite for action) and that we have ineradicable reactive attitudes such that we cannot help praising and blaming each other as moral agents or patients.  He concedes that even the very practice of science requires scientists to act as though they have libertarian freedom and are fit objects of praise and blame.  In a sense, my colleague's belief and argument for determinism (essentially Galen Strawson's case against freedom) has no form of life or social context other than abstract, Clayton might say "disembodied," dialogue.  As far as I know, my colleague's abstract commitment to hard determinism and the necessary illusion of free will is not associated with any practical emotions, a sense of wonder or any form of life.

I will not try to resolve the impasse between Clayton and my friend other than to suggest that a Cambridge Platonist, Ralph Cudworth, has provided the tools to defend libertarian freedom over against Strawson's well-known hard determinism.  If this is right, perhaps the philosopher's tool kit needs both Clayton's social, embodied perspective as well as the formal tools of analysis for those occasions when more disembodied reflection is required.