Religious Convictions in Liberal Politics

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Eberle, Christopher, Religious Convictions in Liberal Politics, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 416pp, $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521011558.

Reviewed by Gerald Gaus, Tulane University


I Eberle’s target in this book is “justificatory liberals” — such as “John Rawls, Charles Larmore, Bruce Ackerman, Robert Audi, Amy Gutman, Thomas Nagel, Lawrence Solum” and me (11). Justificatory liberalism (a term Eberle prefers to “political liberalism”) holds that “because each citizen ought to respect her compatriots, each citizen ought to pursue public justification for her favored coercive laws” (11; emphasis in original). According to justificatory liberals — and this is the focus of Eberle’s objection — “the norm of respect imposes on each citizen an obligation to discipline herself in such a way that she resolutely refrains from supporting any coercive law for which she cannot provide the requisite public justification” (12). And, since justificatory liberals insist that arguments necessarily depending on religious conviction are disqualified as public justifications, they insist that respect for others requires religious citizens to refrain from imposing coercive laws solely on the basis of their religious convictions. “The justificatory liberal is unavoidably committed to the claim that a citizen in a liberal democracy ought not to support (or reject) any coercive law for which she enjoys only a religious justification” (14). Eberle’s book is a reply to such justificatory liberalism and a defense of purely religious justifications for imposing coercion on one’s fellow citizens.

In this review, I will criticize many of Eberle’s main arguments: justificatory liberalism is, I think, far more plausible and appealing than Eberle’s proposal that, at the end of the day, citizens may both respect others and coerce them simply on the basis of their religious convictions. At the outset, however, let me stress that Eberle has written a very good book indeed. It is manifest that he has thought much harder and deeper about justificatory liberalism than justificatory liberals have thought about religious justification and belief. His analysis of religious epistemology and mysticism (ch. 8) clearly demonstrates the extent to which many liberals have attacked caricatures of religious justification. After Eberle’s book, secular liberals must be much more careful in their claims about religious beliefs and their justifications.


Respect for others requires public justification of coercion: that is the clarion call of justificatory liberalism” (54; emphasis in original). Eberle, though, heeds this call in his own way — or at least he heeds some of it. As he sees it, the justificatory liberal typically has in mind two rather different claims:

The principle of pursuit: a citizen should pursue public justification for his favored coercive laws.
The principle of restraint: a citizen should not support any coercive law for which he lacks a public justification (68; emphasis in original).

As Eberle interprets it, according to the principle of pursuit:

If a citizen enjoys only a religious rationale for a given coercive law L, then she lacks a public justification for L … . And if she lacks a public justification for L, then the principle of pursuit obliges her sincerely and conscientiously to do what she can do to discern some rationale for L that articulates appropriately with her compatriots’ distinctive points of view — that will be convincing to them insofar as they are adequately informed and fully rational, or that would be convincing to them, or that they are in a position to criticize, or the like (75).

Eberle’s crucial claim, though, is that “an obligation to pursue public justification doesn’t imply an obligation to exercise restraint” (70). The principle of pursuit only requires “a sincere and conscientious aspiration to public justification” (75) and so says nothing at all about what the citizen should do so long as he pursue public justification. And fulfilling the obligation to pursue public justification does not require that one achieve public justification. Consequently, if a religious citizen does her best to develop a public justification for L but fails, she has fulfilled her obligation to pursue public justification, and may with consistency proceed to endorse L even though she has only religious grounds for it. Eberle thus endorses an “ideal of conscientious engagement” according to which a citizen will (104-105):

(1) seek to arrive at a justification for L that is sound given one’s own system of beliefs and values;
(2) refuse to endorse L if one does not have a good justification for it in one’s own systems of values and beliefs;
(3) seek to convey to others one’s reasons for coercing them;
(4) endeavor to arrive at a public justification for L —one that connects in the appropriate way to the beliefs and values of one’s fellow citizens;
(5) pay attention to others’ objections to, and criticisms of, one’s reasons for coercing them and aim to learn from them;
(6) refuse to endorse any L that violates the integrity of one’s fellow citizens.

A great deal of Eberle’s case depends on the claim — really, the intuition — that a religious citizen who meets (1)-(6), but goes ahead and imposes a coercive law for which he can find only a religious justification nevertheless may still respect them when doing so. If the religious citizen takes no joy in imposing God’s will, is not motivated by a “gleeful imposition of power” or “indifference to his compatriots’ cares and concerns,” the religious citizen respects his fellows even when he imposes such a law on them (113). After all, in trying to publicly justify the law to them the religious citizen does not treat his secular compatriots merely as things, for he attempts to reason from a shared point of view, and one does not do that with mere things.

I confess that my intuitions about the requirements of respect are better expressed by Master Yoda: “Do or do not. There is no try.” It is all very well to try to make me see your point, but if your point is one that I have no good justification to embrace, then in the end I am simply being subjected to your power, however well-intentioned and conscientious you may be. Eberle sees “no reason that we may not impose moral demands on those who lack what they take to be good reasons to adhere to our moral demands” (133). Eberle, of course, holds that in some sense there really are good external reasons for non-believers to accept the demands, since God’s will must yield good reasons. But it is important to stress that Eberle does not simply maintain one can justifiably impose laws on those who take themselves as having no justifications for accepting the law, but one may impose on those who really have no good justification for embracing it. Thus Eberle admits that a secular citizen so imposed upon neither has an accessible reason to conform to the religious demand nor should religious citizens hold her blameworthy for failing to comply; they should pity her, but nevertheless they may go ahead and force her to comply with their view (133).

Eberle appears to have little or no appreciation of the moral costs of viewing other citizens as objects of pity, who cannot see the truth but must be forced to conform to it, though it cannot be justified to them. His model is the moral acceptability of coercing a genocidal politician: she simply must be stopped, even if she cannot see the point of respecting human life. Now it is surely true that those who threaten social life justly may be controlled and even destroyed; as Hobbes points out, those who remain in “the condition of war” may be destroyed without “injustice” (Leviathan, chap. 15). However, in such cases we do not confront each other as responsive moral persons but merely as natural persons who can take action against each other. Even if sometimes we cannot avoid treating others as mere natural persons in this way, to take it as a model for the way that citizens should relate to each other in a liberal democracy is disturbing indeed.


Eberle’s resistance to the principle of restraint (“a citizen should not support any coercive law for which he lacks a public justification”) stems from a sort of standing-Rawls-on-his-head-maneuver. Eberle advances a version of the Rawlsian “strains of commitment” argument according to which it is expecting too much of theistic citizens to bracket their “totalizing and overriding obligation to obey God” — such would be tantamount to annihilating their moral selves (146). And, says Eberle, there is a superior alternative to restraint: “the ideal of conscientious engagement permits a citizen to support coercive laws he conscientiously takes to be mandated by God, even if he lacks a public justification of those laws” (147).

Many secular philosophers may instinctively be critical of this anti-restraint doctrine, yet they should beware: similar anti-restraint views are voiced by “liberal perfectionists” such as Steven Wall (Liberal Perfectionism and Restraint, Cambridge, 1998). As Eberle effectively argues (chap. 8), religious beliefs are not on obviously thinner epistemic ice than are, say, some moral realist beliefs (I agree, but draw a different lesson). Those who refuse to exercise restraint in relation to their moral views — they refuse to bracket their firmly held moral convictions in political argument even when these cannot be justified to others— are badly placed to criticize Eberle’s refusal to embrace constraint vis à vis religious beliefs. Indeed, one of the striking features of this book is how structurally similar are the criticisms of “neutralist liberalism” offered by perfectionists and Eberle: both insist that citizens who firmly and rationally believe that they posses important truths ought to be free to coerce others to conform to them, even when those others have no good reason to embrace such “truths.”


Why, then, not simply accept justificatory liberalism’s principle of restraint along with the view that R is a public reason for law L if and only if all reasonable citizens accept R? As I read his chapter 7, Eberle would like to push the justificatory liberal into a dilemma. The first horn supposes that the justificatory liberal (1) adopts an inclusive characterization of the relevant public to whom justification is addressed, and (2) within this public, considers people much as they are (their present beliefs, values, etc), instead of some idealized version of their present selves (200). Such “populist” interpretations, Eberle suggests, clearly tie justificatory liberalism to respect for the actual public as we find it: the beliefs and values that actual citizens actually accept will form (to use Marilyn Friedman’s phrase) the “legitimation pool”— the pool of relevant beliefs of the relevant people for legitimatising policy (198ff, 378). But if we are resolutely populist, we cannot meet the “sufficiency condition” (205-207); few if any proposals are apt to be justified, as there will always be someone who has no reason to accept any given proposal. Eberle’s stronger claim is that not even basic liberal principles could be justified since some reasonable person will veto them (i.e., some person will not have reason to embrace them), and so justificatory liberalism is self-defeating — not substantively liberal at all (205). His weaker claim is that characterizing the public inclusively and realistically will so truncate politics that many of the issues that are now on the political agenda cannot be resolved, with the result that we will have an unhealthy political life (206).

In order to avoid the first horn of the dilemma, the justificatory liberal may seek to ratchet up the criteria for being a member of the justificatory public, restricting and idealizing the agents that participate in public justification (for example, by restricting the legitimation pool to those with adequate information). Thus the second horn of the dilemma: embracing this exclusiveness will give the liberal his conclusions, but only by building in sectarian (i.e., liberal) constraints right at the outset in determining who is a member of the justificatory public (228). Thus the dilemma: either the liberal has a non-sectarian conception of public justification (in which case liberalism is not vindicated), or he vindicates liberalism, but only by appealing to a sectarian understanding of public justification.

There is real insight here. Most importantly, I think few justificatory liberals have confronted the possibility that plausible conceptions of public justification have the radical consequence of removing a great deal from the political agenda, since no position on many current political issues is capable of public justification. Since most justificatory liberals are also friends of an extensive state, Eberle shows that they confront a real problem. Overall, though, the argument is not compelling, especially if (as do I), one embraces the implication that justificatory liberalism shrinks the domain of the political. Eberle’s argument depends on the claims that (1) as soon as we idealize enough so that basic liberal principles are successfully justified to the relevant set of agents, the idealization manifests the liberal’s own “parochial” presuppositions, and (2) the agents so idealized are so far removed from actual agents that respecting the idealized agents no longer plausibly manifests respect for real people whom our constructions seek to idealize (231). As Eberle’s usually realizes, the devils are in the details, but I do not see that he has shown that we cannot both (a) idealize enough so that core liberal principles are justified (i.e., say only moral or reasonable persons form the relevant set, and they have no manifestly false beliefs) and (b) do not build on suppositions that are objectionably parochial.


Eberle is especially effective in replying to two common arguments against appeal to religious belief in liberal politics. First, drawing on the experiences of the European religious wars of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries, it is often claimed that unless most citizens “privatize” their religious commitments (1) we shall be consumed by strife, chaos, death and destruction (158) or, more modestly, (2) we shall experience “social and political maladies that lack the severity of religious conflict, but are serious nonetheless” (167). Eberle shows that the first is simply not plausible; twentieth-century America is not seventeenth England. Most importantly, in contemporary America freedom of religion and non-establishment are settled convictions among the vast majority of religious citizens, so the attempt to forcibly convert others to orthodoxy — which was the crux of the earlier disputes — is simply not part of the political landscape today (161-162). Eberle carefully criticizes the more modest “malady” argument; social divisions will result from excluding arguments that require religious suppositions as well as including them. And in any event, it is hard to know how much social division would result from allowing religious considerations and how this compares to the social divisions that accompany other political disputes. The calculations are so complex and uncertain that consequentialist arguments are inconclusive.

More interestingly, Eberle raises some powerful objections against theories of public justification that seek to characterize specific epistemic standards required for public justifications — such as public accessibility, replicability, fallibilism, inerrancy, external criticism, independent conformability — and then contend that religious beliefs fail to meet the standards, and so must be excluded from the public realm. Although there is much to argue with in these complicated and thoughtful discussions, one of Eberle’s most successful strategies is to show the epistemic similarities between moral and religious beliefs. Some justificatory liberals exclude religious considerations by showing that they cannot meet the criteria employed to evaluate observation statements, but then admit moral judgments into the realm of public reason even though they too fail to meet those criteria. If justificatory liberals are to defend this combination of exclusion and inclusion, they need to do a lot more careful work on moral and religious epistemology.


Without doubt, Eberle has raised the level of discussion of the place of religious argument in liberal politics. My admiration, however, is tempered by the judgment that, in the end, Eberle has gone a long way toward showing that deeply religious citizens are not good candidates for conscientious liberal democrats. As Eberle describes many religious citizens, “they regard themselves as bound to obey a set of overriding and totalizing obligations imposed upon them by their Creator. They regard their failure to discharge those obligations as anathema” (183). Moreover he persuasively argues that these obligations often, perhaps typically, are not understood as private commitments but as requiring political action. If this is their view, it is very hard to see how they can accept an obligation to conform to adverse democratic decisions on issues relevant to these obligations. To ask them to conform to a majority decision they do not accept would seem to “require them knowingly and willingly to disobey God” (183). If it would be disobedient to God not to raise religious arguments, surely it is still disobedient to have raised them, but then act contrary to them because the majority has decided otherwise. Eberle himself seems caught in a dilemma. (1) Religious citizens may be reasonably doubtful that they know the will of God; they can accept adverse democratic decisions on the grounds that the majority’s judgment is also reasonable, and in light of this, religious citizens should not insist that their uncertain interpretations be law. But if this is their view, then it also seems that they can abide by the principle of restraint in political argument by refusing to appeal to their uncertain interpretations when arguing about what the law should be: they can live with the law failing to reflect their view of God’s will. (2) If they cannot accept the principle of restraint in political argument because it will be too much of a strain (see III above) to fail to act as God tells them, then they will feel unable to obey laws contrary to their understanding of God’s will. Since Eberle rejects (1), he seems committed to (2). Religious Convictions in Liberal Politics appears to be something of a rebel’s catechism.