Religious Ethics and Constructivism: A Metaethical Inquiry

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Kevin Jung (ed.), Religious Ethics and Constructivism: A Metaethical Inquiry, Routledge, 2018, 209pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138103412.

Reviewed by Robert Gressis, California State University, Northridge


Since John Rawls's 1980 article, "Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory,"[1] constructivism has been seen as an attractive metaethical position, one that has merits of both moral realism (in that it allows for the reality of moral facts) and moral antirealism (in that it parsimoniously grounds moral facts in agents' attitudes rather than in something independent of agents). However, there has been little engagement between non-theistic versions of constructivism and religious ethics (ethics that claims an important role for an active God in our moral theorizing). This is rather surprising, for two reasons. First, religious ethicists have engaged with other prominent metaethical positions, especially moral realism (usually, in order to show that it fits best with a theistic worldview) and moral nihilism (often, in order to show that nihilism is the position one is forced to, absent theism); consequently, one would think they would have engaged more with constructivism, if for no other reason than to show that it doesn't work without theism. Second, Jung claims that many religious ethicists nowadays are at least "implicitly" (8) moral antirealists. Insofar as constructivism is an antirealist position, then you would have expected more religious ethicists to explore constructivism as a good way to be antirealist.

This book "brings together a diverse group of scholars representing different philosophical and theological outlooks to discuss the merits of constructivism vis-à-vis religious ethics" (8). The point is to "help engender and renew interest in metaethics among religious ethicists, while serving as a benchmark for further scholarship on constructivism in religious ethics" (vi). Thus, it seems that its audience is religious ethicists, rather than both religious ethicists and non-religious constructivists. Given that audience, the book does well, as each essay spends a lot of space familiarizing its audience with constructivism.

That said, even secular constructivists could benefit from grappling with the book. On the one hand, some of the contributors argue that at least one version of secular constructivism is compatible with religious (in particular, Christian) theism. So, any secular constructivist who wanted to argue from the truth of constructivism and its incompatibility with theism to the falsity of theism will have to deal with those essays. On the other hand, some of the contributors argue that secular constructivism fails on its own terms. So, secular constructivists may want to look at those essays to judge for themselves whether their criticisms have bite.

In "Kantian Constructivism, Baseball, and Christian Ethics", Paul Weithman describes and argues for a kind of constructivism, and then argues that it works well with theism. The kind of constructivism he argues for is not what other contributors, following Sharon Street,[2] call "unrestricted constructivism" (7n29) -- that is, constructivism about all (at least, practical) normativity. Instead, Weithman defends constructivism about norms of distributive justice, while holding to realism about some other aspects of morality.

Weithman tries to motivate his constructivism about distributive justice by analogizing it to constructivism about games. Imagine a group of people coming upon a wooden stick, a hard ball, and four bags lying in a field of grass. They want to amuse themselves, so they decide to impose a set of rules (namely, those of baseball) upon themselves to govern their interactions with each other while using these instruments. Note these rules are general (they don't make reference to any particular player), they're set up to enable everyone to have fun, and, insofar as they cease functioning (say, because people have figured out a way to game the system), they are revisable. Because these players invent these rules to solve a problem they have (how to enjoy themselves), and because the game they come up with solves this problem, it's a good solution. So too with distributive justice: if the rules people come up with to distribute resources are ones they would find satisfactory (if they were reasoning clearly), then those rules have authority over them.

Weithman concludes by considering how Christians might object to constructivism. To my mind, the most important objection, and the one other contributors engage with, is that it renders God extraneous to morality. He responds that constructivism does this no more than moral realism, according to which the moral facts explain why God commands (or values, etc.) what He does. On moral realism, the facts are unconstructed and on constructivism they're constructed, but in both cases, God is responsive to the facts. Thus, constructivism should be just as acceptable to theists as realism.[3]

In "A Humean Account of What Wrongness Amounts To", Kevin Kinghorn argues for Humean constructivism about deontic normativity while maintaining realism about axiology. The difference between Kantian and Humean constructivism is this: Kantian constructivists derive moral norms from the nature of agency itself, whereas Humean constructivists derive them from an individual agent's motivational set. Thus, Kantian constructivism aspires to universality about deontic norms, whereas Humean constructivism allows only for generality.

Kinghorn is a constructivist about deontic normativity not only because constructivism is ontologically more parsimonious than realism, but also because he sees a conceptual connection between wrongness, blameworthiness, and obligation. He thinks that the idea of wrongness emerges because certain kinds of action tend to produce significant harms,[4] and so people come to think of them as not to be done. Because people think of them as not to be done, the concept of obligation emerges, and because some people continue to do these harmful actions even though they know better, the concept of blame emerges as well. His "central claim" is that "facts about the wrongness of some action are reducible to facts about some individual's or group's intent to sanction those who perform that action" (47).

Because the concept of wrongness involves an intent to sanction (if you think an action is wrong, you are willing to blame the person who does it), judging something as wrong requires deliberation: you have to figure out -- however quickly -- whether you're willing to sanction someone who does wrong, for sometimes that involves personal cost (51). This is why Kinghorn thinks wrongness is constructed: judgments of wrongness emerge, even ideally, out of a process of deliberation about whether we're willing to sanction those who do what we think is wrong; and since different people, given their different motivational sets, will pull off this cost-benefit analysis differently, they will arrive at different judgments of wrongness.[5]

How does this fit with religious ethics? On Kinghorn's view, God's role is not to determine what actions are wrong; after all, whether an action is wrong, for a particular person, is a function of her drawing the correct conclusion from her motivational set about whether she'd be willing to sanction someone who did that action. Instead, God's role is to help us live a good life. Not only can God tell us how to flourish, but also interacting with God is itself a great good.

In his "What Should Theists Say about Constructivist Positions in Metaethics?" Christian B. Miller argues that theists should reject secular versions of constructivism. He lists four kinds of constructivism: relativism, where what is normatively required depends on actual agents' attitudes; hypothetical constructivism, where what is normatively required depends either on improved versions of actual human agents' attitudes, or on ideal agents' attitudes; and theistic constructivism, where what is normatively required depends on God's attitudes.

Miller provides two arguments for thinking theistic constructivism superior to hypothetical constructivism.[6] The first is the comparison argument. According to it, theists should think that God's attitudes are comparatively more important for determining normative properties than a hypothetical agent's attitudes, whether that agent is an improved version of an actual agent or a non-existent ideal agent. The intuition behind the comparison argument is fairly straightforward: if you're a theist, you think that an all-knowing, all-loving being is actual; and if that's what you already believed, why wouldn't you think God's attitudes were more relevant to determining what is morally required than any hypothetical agent's?

I suspect a theistic constructivist would respond in one of two ways to the comparison argument. First, he could give Kinghorn's response: we have reason to think that wrongness is constructed because agents have to go through a deliberative process in order to determine whether they think it is worth it to sanction a particular behavior. Second, the theistic constructivist could argue on behalf of constructivism, at least about deontic norms, on the grounds that only constructivism explains their normative authority: you are obligated to do X because you would assent to X if you reasoned properly.

Miller's second argument is the divine normative properties argument, which is an argument against unrestricted versions of secular constructivism. These unrestricted versions hold not only that deontic, but also that axiological facts depend on hypothetical agents' responses. Miller points out, rightly, that this would make God's own goodness dependent on how hypothetical finite agents responded to Him, which undermines God's aseity. That said, none of the theistic constructivists in this book endorse unrestricted constructivism.

In "Kantian Constructivism, Autonomy, and Religious Ethics", Charles Lockwood focuses on Rawls's Kantian constructivism. He offers two criticisms: first, Rawls's constructivism is incoherent as a philosophical position; and second, Rawls's interpretation of Kant is implausible.

The main attraction of Rawls's view is that it explains why moral norms are authoritative: if we reasoned according to a procedure we would endorse if we were rational, we would reach certain conclusions about morality, and those conclusions are binding on us. But Lockwood rightly wonders why an ideally rational version of myself should have authority over the actual me. The answer he attributes to Rawls is that it's just a fact that the judgments of such beings are better than the judgments of normal people. But either this fact is itself constructed or it's not. If it is constructed, then we have to ask what kind of procedure led to its construction (not to mention that an infinite regress looms); and if it's not constructed, we have to ask why other normative facts have to be constructed given that this one need not be. Lockwood thinks that Rawls has no good answers to this challenge, so he concludes that Rawls's constructivism fails.

Whether or not Rawls's constructivism fails, Lockwood also offers an alternative construal of autonomy. On his reading of Kant (with which I agree), when Kant discusses autonomy, he does not mean that we must construct the moral law, for the moral law commands what it does independent of anyone's (including God's) responses. Indeed, the moral law is the law of a rational will -- it simply describes how a perfectly rational will (like God's) wills. The reason Kant describes acting in accord with the moral law as "autonomous" is that the moral law is the law of your own will; consequently, when you act in accord with the moral law, you act according to your own will.

In "Grounds of Normativity: Constructivism, Realism, and Theism", Kevin Jung criticizes the unrestricted constructivism of Christine Korsgaard and Sharon Street and then defends moral realism. Jung does a nice job of presenting Korsgaard's view at a fair level of detail and then giving the standard objections to it. But I'm not convinced by Jung's response to Street (though I suspect I don't understand what Jung is up to). According to Street, you find yourself with a set of desires (given to you by evolution, culture, and personal experience), and normativity has to do with finding a reflective equilibrium given the desires you have: if you would have desire D after reflective equilibrium, then D is licit. The problem with Street's view, according to Jung, is that she doesn't properly account for error: she claims that error results from not satisfying the desires that you would try to satisfy were you in a reflective equilibrium; but Jung points out that some of our errors are more intentional than that. Sometimes, we know what we should do, given our desires, but we don't do it anyway. I don't see why Street can't just admit this criticism and move on; this seems to be an issue in moral psychology rather than metaethics. In the rest of his article, Jung explains how to ground normative facts given moral realism. Here his view, not only of the grounding of axiological facts but also of the relationship between God and morality, is similar to Kinghorn's.

The remaining two chapters explore Hegelian constructivism. Molly Farneth's aim in her "Constructivism in Ethics: A View from Hegelian Semantics", is "to show that semantics -- and, in particular, Hegel's semantics -- has something important to add to these debates [between realism and constructivism and between Humean and Kantian constructivism]" (64n6). The important thing that Hegel's constructivism has to add is that whereas Kantian and Humean constructivisms hold that individuals construct particular normative claims, Hegel notes that not just the claims, but the content and even the truth of those claims is constructed as well.

Take "love your neighbor": its contents are constructed in that what counts as loving and who counts as your neighbor will change over time, depending on social facts. The meaning of "love" and "neighbor" change from era to era as a result of negotiations among people owing to their changing desires, environment, technology, and so on. As for the claim's truth, we should first note that Hegel is a deflationist about truth, so there is no question of "love your neighbor" being true because of a correspondence between it and a non-natural fact. Instead, its being true is undefinable, but what makes it true are social facts.

Let me elaborate. For all that has been said so far, one might think that Hegel is a simple-minded social constructivist who has the view that if a community endorses X, then X is true. But Hegel thinks a community can be in error: a community develops certain concepts that arise in response to certain situations or experiences, but if people become alienated from their concepts given their changing situation, then they will change those concepts' extension.

David A. Clairmont's "On the Moral Significance of Nature: A Comparison of Hegelian Constructivism and Natural Law", compares Jeffrey Stout's Hegelian constructivism to Jean Porter's natural law theory, in particular in the attitude both thinkers take to nature.

In his constructivism, Stout relies on Hegelian terminology to distinguish among three things: nature, spirit, and the absolute. "Nature" refers to everything that is real, "spirit" to our ways of talking and thinking about everything that is real, and "the absolute" to the standards that underlie spirit.[7] Stout understands nature as non-teleological; according to our best science, nature is just matter in motion -- significance only enters into the world with the advent of spirit (i.e., when evolution produces rational beings like ourselves who then think and talk about and relate to nature). Consequently, nature has no relevance to morality, so something like natural law theory is misconceived. Clairmont points out that Stout's understanding of nature as inherently meaningless depends on a particular philosophy of science, specifically, one according to which the fundamental facts about physics fix all other facts. But Clairmont notes that there is no clear-cut philosophy of science that the expert community endorses, so there is room to understand nature as morally relevant after all.

Jean Porter believes in a metaphysically more robust account of nature than Stout; their greatest point of disagreement is that she believes in a human nature that underlies spirit and he doesn't. This nature not only gives rise to certain basic desires that recur across time and culture, it is also part of what makes certain activities, experiences, etc. be good for us and count towards our flourishing. That said, Porter allows that it can be quite difficult to tell what will contribute to our flourishing; not only that, but how to advance one's flourishing will also depend on what kind of social setting you are in. So, despite her natural law ethic, she can accommodate many of Stout's Hegelian insights.

All told, this book is a good start on an engagement between religious ethics and constructivism and will be particularly useful to religious ethicists interested in constructivism.

[1] John Rawls, "Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory," The Journal of Philosophy 77, no. 9 (September 1980): 516-72.

[2] Sharon Street, "What Is Constructivism in Ethics and Metaethics?" Philosophy Compass 5, no. 5 (May 1, 2010).

[3] Up to this point, Weithman is careful to note that his is a constructivism about distributive justice rather than morality. And yet he discusses the objection that constructivism renders God extraneous to morality in general. The best way to defend Weithman on this point, I think, is to hold that distributive justice either intersects with, or is a subset of, morality. So, insofar as Weithman's constructivism renders God extraneous to distributive justice, then it renders God extraneous to an important part of morality.

[4] Kinghorn defines harms as unpleasant mental states, so there are facts about what does and does not harm people (see pp. 41-42).

[5] As stated, Kinghorn's view seems subject to the objection that if you're afraid of someone because he has so much more power than you, then what he does will not be wrong by your lights, because you wouldn't be willing to sanction him. But Kinghorn writes, "Our agreement that an action is wrong simply is our taking up a normative stance of intending to sanction (in such forms as blame and punishment) toward those who perform that action." So perhaps Kinghorn can avoid this objection by holding that, as long as you're willing to blame someone just in your mind, without saying or doing anything, then that's all it takes to judge something to be wrong. But if that's his view, then it's not clear why it would take any deliberation to judge something as wrong; judgments of wrongness would be simultaneous with judgments that a particular action has caused a significant harm. 

[6] He quickly dismisses relativism, and he doesn't spend time considering whether moral realism is superior to constructivism, although he himself endorses a version of theistic constructivism.

[7] E.g., if our social practices logically entail that we should do A, but the community as a whole thinks that we should do ~A, then, according to spirit we should do ~A but according to the absolute we should do A; thus, the absolute refers to the standards that really underlie spirit, not the standards that spirit thinks underlie spirit.