Religious Pluralism and Values in the Public Sphere

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Lenn E. Goodman, Religious Pluralism and Values in the Public Sphere, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 221pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107658059.

Reviewed by Maeve Cooke, University College Dublin


Lenn Goodman makes a powerful plea for a cultural pluralism that finds its ideal in an on-going conversation among cultures in all their richness and individuals in all their uniqueness. His vision of pluralism starts from the dignity of the human person, is rooted in an idea of openness to others and emphasizes the importance of fostering cultural conditions that would safeguard dignity and enable individual human flourishing. Far from denying our deep differences with one another, he enjoins us to see these differences as opportunities for learning, and as reminders of the partiality of our own commitments and convictions. While his argument applies to all cultural differences, not merely religious ones, his focus is on religious differences as the salient cultural differences among us, for "it is in religions that the values we hold most precious are most elaborately articulated." (2). Evidently, this is not a relativist or sceptical position, for to learn from another's views or ways is always implicitly to acknowledge their truth content. Importantly, in contrast to some influential contemporary positions, for example, Habermas', Goodman holds that individual religious experiences are expressible in thought and can be articulated in language, making them accessible in principle to others, enabling them to understand and critically appropriate them. In insisting on critical appropriation, however, he shares Habermas' view that this is the norm that should guide our relation to values and traditions, be they familiar or alien to us.

Goodman draws attention to the need to distinguish between the personal and the social question for religious pluralism. To ask what it means for me that others cherish beliefs and norms different from mine is not the same as to ask how much diversity a society can tolerate and what it can never tolerate (18). Nonetheless, the two questions are intertwined, and his first chapter sketches a basis for personal and societal pluralism as regards religion. The second chapter addresses Rawls' argument in Political Liberalism (1993) that religious and metaphysical discourse has no proper place in democratic political deliberation, while the fourth chapter targets the abstract, stipulative character of both Rawls' A Theory of Justice (1971, revised 1999) and his The Law of Peoples (1999). Drawing on Jewish sources and experiences "although not for the imprimatur of divine command" (106), chapter three identifies certain moral "minima and maxima". Moral minima refer to practices that we should all condemn as violations of human dignity, such as genocide, terrorism, polygamy and female genital mutilation. Moral maxima refer to ways in which human dignity can be fostered; here Goodman singles out the norms articulated in the Decalogue, whose historical particularity do not in his view diminish their centrality.

Chapters two and four offer trenchant critiques of Rawls' approach to religious and cultural diversity, with an acerbic eloquence and forcefulness not often found in contemporary academic discussions. For the most part, however, the criticisms raised have been made by others; none were new to me. More rewarding were chapters one and three.

In chapter one I found Goodman's identification of three basic approaches to diversity in contemporary liberal societies particularly helpful. These are: (i) splitting faith from practice (beliefs are held to be private, practices are potentially matters of public concern); (ii) splitting essence from accident (at bottom all religions are deemed to agree); and (iii) romanticising the religious other (reasserting boundaries through celebrating the other). While here, too, his objections to each of the strategies are not original, his discussion of the limitations of each strategy is insightful and helps to show the merits of the alternative pluralist model he advocates.

Chapter three was unexpectedly invigorating. Theorists who seek to identify universal moral minima tend either to offer banalities or display an unacknowledged cultural bias. It is less common, today, to identify moral maxima: rich articulations of universal themes that transcend their historical particularity and speak, potentially, to everyone; those who do so open themselves to accusations of cultural imperialism. Goodman avoids all these pitfalls. His deep commitment to encouraging conversations across religious diversity shines through his politically, philosophically and theologically informed, richly textured, hermeneutically sensitive and often illuminating discussions of why, for example, polygamy is heinous and why the fourth Commandment "Remember the Sabbath day, to keep it holy" (p. 134) offers universally valuable moral guidance. This chapter exemplifies Goodman's insistence that arguments are never abstract but always emerge from a context, and, in consequence, on the need for sensitivity to the tone and tenor of the ethos from which an argument emerges.

Much of the power of Goodman's plea for pluralism derives from his eloquent invocation of an idea of human dignity that is not construed in purely formal terms but has a transcendent value that can be captured only with the "full resources of law, culture and human tact" (106). Coupled with this, convincingly, is advocacy of a role for public institutions in humanizing human life. One of the policy implications of his pluralist proposal, therefore, is that the State should not just tolerate but "foster religions, pluralistically and even-handedly" (51). However, the envisioned role for the State is not perfectionist in an authoritarian manner, It does not aim to educate its citizens to live in accordance with a view of human flourishing that it imposes on them; rather it allows citizens to determine for themselves the extent to which and the manner in which State-backed institutional support is conducive to their human flourishing.

Furthermore, the very humanistic concerns that mandate State support of religion also limit the manner and means of that support. Thus, the advocated support for religion is not establishment or even semi-establishment, but rather along the lines of public support of the arts, athletics, education, information, science, recreation and other spheres of learning and discovery. Secularity, not secularism, is his catchword. "Secularity rightly holds our public institutions aloof from partisanship or pandering to any sectarian ideal. Secularism is a different matter. It seeks to rid society of religious interests and ideas, practices and values". (21).

I end with one suggestion and one question. The suggestion is to drop the occasional use of terms such as "coping with" and "accommodating" diversity and instead consistently to refer to "being open to" and "learning from" it. Not only is everything interesting and important in the book best expressed in the vocabulary of openness and learning, the two vocabularies point in quite different directions. One is the Rawlsian direction of cordoning off religious and cultural norms and practices from encounters with others, which are perceived in the first instance as threatening; Goodman rightly rejects this path. The other is the direction of individual and cultural enrichment and transformation through encounters with others, which are perceived in the first instance as conducive to human flourishing. Goodman invites us to see the attractions of this other path, and the book's great strength is its vivid presentation of these attractions, thereby encouraging us to follow it.

My question concerns Goodman's distinction between romanticising the religious other, which he rejects, and being open to the religious other and learning through encounters with it, which he proposes. One way of making sense of the distinction is in terms of stasis and change. A romanticising relation to the other affirms a pre-given, fixed identity, both on the side of the individual or culture that is perceiving and the individual or culture that is perceived. A relation of openness with a view to learning, by contrast, potentially transforms the identities of both perceiver and perceived. If we are fully to grasp Goodman's pluralistic vision, however, and attempt to live our lives by it, we need to know more about how and why the romanticising relation to the other results in a reifying reduction, coupled with stultifying identity-affirmation, while the advocated relation is conducive to human flourishing cognitively, emotionally and practically. Filling in the picture, it seems to me, will require discussion of truth as the transcendent "authority" (for want of a better word) that enables us to speak of the shifts in perception, feeling and practice resulting from mutual learning as beneficial changes. For, it is not just potential transformation of identities that is envisaged, it is transformation for the better. Goodman's book makes clear that "better" here means better from the point of view of human flourishing, understood in a sense that transcends the conceptions of human flourishing held by particular individuals or cultures. Can the concept of truth help us to make sense of this subject- and culture-transcending idea of human flourishing? And, if so, how should we conceive of truth? Goodman has written a book on truth (In Defense of Truth: A Pluralistic Approach, 2001). I have not read it, but it is now high on my list.