Remembering from the Outside: Personal Memory and the Perspectival Mind

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Christopher Jude McCarroll, Remembering from the Outside: Personal Memory and the Perspectival Mind, Oxford University Press, 2018, 220pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190674267.

Reviewed by Felipe De Brigard, Duke University


Until very recently, the field of philosophy of memory was almost non-existent. But in the last decade, there has been such a resurgence of interest in philosophical questions pertaining to memory and remembering that it is becoming one of the most active areas in the philosophy of mind. Christopher Jude McCarroll's book is a wonderful addition to this fascinating and growing research area. In it, McCarroll discusses an intriguing phenomenon: the fact that we often remember autobiographical episodic memories, both voluntarily and involuntarily, from a point of view other than the one from which we experienced the original event. Known in the psychological literature as the field/observer distinction, memory's capacity to shift perspectives has intrigued researchers since, at least, Giovanni Nigro and Ulric Neisser's seminal work in 1983. I don't think I'm exaggerating when saying that McCarroll's extraordinary book constitutes the most up-to-date, thorough, and thought-provoking study of the field/observer phenomenon since then. This book promises to become a landmark work, not only for philosophers, but also for cognitive scientists, social psychologists, and others interested in memory, imagination, and perspective-shift in mental simulation.

According to its preface, the book has

four nested and interdependent aims: 1) to defend the possibility that genuine memories can be recalled from an observer perspective, 2) to understand observer perspectives better, 3) to understand personal memories more fully by way of understanding observer perspectives, and 4) to provide an understanding of the perspectival mind, by way of understanding personal memories and observer perspectives. (p. ix)

But along the way, in the seven chapters that constitute this monograph, McCarroll manages to argue for many less overarching but equally important claims, with varying degrees of controversy, each of which contributes to several ongoing discussions in the philosophy of memory.

The book begins with a short history of the field/observer distinction and some of the key issues that the phenomena of observer memories pose to both philosophical and scientific accounts of remembering. In particular, McCarroll reviews a number of extant arguments aimed at concluding that observer memories are neither genuine nor veridical autobiographical memories, either because 1) the event is remembered from a perspective other than the one from which it was experienced, 2) observer memories constitute marked distortions from the original event, or 3) the observer perspective involves, in the content of the recollection, a representation of oneself from a position other from that which one actually occupied. Many of these arguments are relatively well-known, and tacitly accepted, by both preservationists and constructivists about memory. But McCarroll promises to go against the orthodoxy and argue instead that observer memories can be both genuine and veridical, that they need not involve more distortion than ordinary reconstructed field memories, and that the perspective from which we tend to remember observer memories is, in fact, unoccupied, and thus the moniker "observer memories" is actually a misnomer; better to refer to these sorts of mental events as memories "from the outside". Lots of promises, I know, but, boy, does he deliver.

One of the first and most clever steps in his argumentation comes from the distinction between constructive encoding and reconstructive retrieval, which he introduces in Chapter 2, and further elaborates in Chapter 3. One of the main arguments against the claim that observer memories are genuine memories comes from what McCarroll calls the "perceptual impossibility argument". This argument, which appears in the philosophical literature on memory in various guises, basically asserts that observer memories cannot be genuine memories because their content involves seeing oneself from the outside, which cannot possibly be the content of the initial perception, as it is impossible to perceive oneself from the outside. As such, observer memories represent a perceptual impossibility. But McCarroll disagrees. He thinks that partisans of the perceptual impossibility argument neglect the fact that, in addition to visual perception, experiences involve a plethora of sensory, temporal, proprioceptive and spatial information, all of which participate in the process of memory encoding. Of course, not everything that is experienced gets to be encoded in memory, as the process of encoding is both selective and constructive. Yet, for that very same reason, it is perfectly feasible that, during encoding, we may get to include not only egocentric but also allocentric information about our surroundings, in addition to other kinds of perceptual information. And if allocentric information is available during encoding, then information about personal experiences may be encoded already from a perspective other than our typical first-person point of view. Remembering from the outside may not only be a product of reconstruction at retrieval: experiences may already be encoded as being perceived from an external point of view.

In Chapter 3, McCarroll develops this extremely intriguing idea, and further argues against both preservationists and constructivists (myself included [De Brigard 2014]), for whom observer memories are clear cases of memory distortion and, thus, of ordinary yet false recollections. But why should that be so? The content available at encoding is much richer than we normally acknowledge, for it includes internal and external, multi-modal, egocentric and allocentric information. We often forget that what we experience is not limited to light bouncing off external objects and hitting our retina, or sound waves caressing the hairs in our cochlea. We experience the world while we think, reflect, imagine, and mentally simulate our surroundings. The availability of rich allocentric information, then, enables us to think about observer memories as being not only the product of reconstructive retrieval but also of constructive encoding. Moreover, the fact that we can encode an experience with proprioceptive, kinesthetic and affective content helps to explain both why we can non-inferentially know that the person seen "from the outside" in an observer memory is oneself, and why recollection of observer memories is accompanied by the same "warmth and intimacy" -- to use the Jamesian trope -- we normally feel when retrieving episodic memories of our personal past, despite their unusual perspective. If we can experience the world from the outside, and encode memories from an external perspective, then it is not true that all observer memories are distorted. Sure, just as with field memories, observer memories may sometimes be distorted and false, but then again they might very well be genuine and true. Even constructivists -- myself included -- need to accept that we have no reason to think that a perspective shift in autobiographical recollection de facto involves more construction at encoding, and more reconstruction at retrieval, than memories that are recollected from a field perspective.

Observer memories are typically described as recollections of past personal events in which we see ourselves from the perspective of an external observer. This characterization strongly suggests that such an external observer is, in fact, oneself. As a result, some have argued (e.g., Vendler 1979) that observer memories cannot be genuine memories, let alone veridical memories, because of the tripartite nature of their mnemonic content. That is, unlike field memories, in which the remembering self and the remembered self are taken to be one and the same (in part because they both share the same point of view), observer memories introduce another self -- the observed self -- that does not share the point of view of either the remembering self or the observing self. However, McCarroll disagrees with this characterization, and in Chapter 4 he masterfully argues for the claim that when we remember from the outside, the perspective of the observer is, in fact, unoccupied. It is wrong, then, to think that when I remember myself in a particular past episode from an observer perspective, I am thereby also representing myself as being precisely such an external observer. On the contrary, McCarroll argues, it is simply not the case that in addition to the observed remembered self, with which the present remembering self immediately and non-inferentially identifies, there is a need to further postulate a third remembered self occupying the point of view from which the remembered event is recalled. The allocentric spatial information available at encoding, and later on accessible at retrieval, allows us to adopt a plethora of points of view from the outside without additionally requiring us to think of ourselves as the occupants of such perspectives. I can mentally simulate the allocentric space surrounding my experience of the world right now, and later on recall it from a bird's eye point of view, but in so doing I need not be the bird. In fact, there need not be a bird at all.

The traditional characterization of observer memories as involving a remembered observing-self also serves to explain why, despite the fact that one sees oneself from a perspective other than the one from which the original event was experienced, the memory nonetheless is experienced with the same warmth and intimacy with which ordinary field autobiographical memories are felt. However, if McCarroll is right and remembering from the outside does not include an observer self as part of the mnemonic content, how come we don't feel undetached from the observed self, which appears to be no different than any other person included in a mnemonic content? The answer, spelled out in great detail in Chapter 5, involves a fascinating excursus into the nature of perspective, the ambiguities with the notions of "internal" and "external" points of view, and both empirical and conceptual evidence supporting the claim that while remembering from the outside may involve a shift in perspective, the mnemonic content can still include kinesthetic and proprioceptive information that makes the identification with the observed remembered self seamless, immediate, and non-inferential.

Curiously, despite the fact that in observer memories I recall myself from the outside, typically such recollections exhibit immunity to error through misidentification. This is very much unlike the apparently parallel case in which I see a photograph of myself, taken from the outside, but I fail to see the photographed individual as myself. Why is it that, when remembering from the outside, we are immune to error through misidentification? McCarroll's strategy to address this issue involves a variation on François Recanati's "Strong Moderate Relativism" framework (Recanati 2007). According to this framework, there is a difference between explicit and implicit de se thoughts. Misidentification errors in de se thoughts occur when the self is part of the explicit content. Intriguingly, Recanati rules out observer memories as genuine memories and considers the remembered observed self as part of the explicit de se content. But then, McCarroll asks, why is it that observer memories exhibit immunity to error through misidentification? Assuming -- contra Recanati, and as argued in the first part of the book -- that observer memories can be genuine memories, then they should be the sorts of de se thoughts for which misidentification errors should be possible. But they are not -- so what gives? McCarroll's solution is two-tiered: he first argues that in remembering from the outside the self is part of the implicit, not the explicit, content of the de se thought and, second, that remembering from the outside is simply a particular mode of presentation in which a remembered event can be recalled. Remembering from a field perspective is one way of recalling a particular event; the same event can be presented from a different point of view, e.g., from the outside.

To me, Chapter 6 is by far the most underdeveloped in McCarroll's book. But I do not mean this as a criticism: I think it is underdeveloped because it likely requires a much longer treatment. Much of what he says there would likely be controversial for philosophers of language and semanticists, yet for that reason it constitutes a rich source of questions for future research. Many of those questions are anticipated in the seventh and final chapter, where McCarroll weaves together many threads discussed throughout the book, and reminds us how they come to inform the four aims the book was set up to answer. I really can't recommend this book enough. As an interdisciplinary researcher, and as someone who is interested in philosophical and scientific questions about the nature of memory and remembering, McCarroll's book has it all: it offers a thorough and illuminating review of the philosophy and the psychology of observer memories, it adumbrates the phenomenon of remembering from the outside with autobiographical and fictional examples, and it presents clearly articulated and thoroughly developed arguments in favor of the claim that observer memories can be genuine, veridical, and definitely worth thinking about.


De Brigard, F. (2014). Is memory for remembering? Recollection as a form of episodic hypothetical thinking. Synthese, 191, 155-185.

Nigro, G., & Neisser, U. (1983). Point of view in personal memories. Cognitive Psychology, 15, 467-482.

Recanati, F. (2007). Perspectival Thought: A Plea for (Moderate) Relativism. Oxford University Press.

Vendler, Z. (1979). Vicarious Experience. Revue de Mètaphysique et de Morale. 84(2): 161-173.