Remembering Socrates: Philosophical Essays

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Lindsay Judson and Vassilis Karasmanis (eds.), Remembering Socrates: Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2006. 226pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199276137.

Reviewed by Andrew Mason, University of Edinburgh


The papers collected in this book were all first presented at a conference on Socrates held in Athens and Delphi in 2001, under the auspices of the European Cultural Centre of Delphi, to mark the 2400th anniversary of Socrates’ death. The full proceedings of that conference have already been published (V. Karasmanis, ed. Socrates: 2400 Years since his Death, Delphi, European Cultural Centre of Delphi, 2004); this volume assembles some of the most notable papers, by leading Socratic and Platonic scholars, in a more compact form. A few of the papers have been revised for this volume, though in only one case, the paper by Theodore Scaltsas, are the revisions extensive.

Only one of the contributors, Gerhard Seel, confronts the ‘Socratic problem’, asking to what extent the ‘Socrates’ presented to us in the works of Plato and others reflects the historical person. For the most part, the essays focus on the figure of Socrates as he is presented in the writings of others. Unsurprisingly, the majority of essays deal with themes from the dialogues of Plato commonly called Socratic (including the Meno); but Xenophon, the later Plato, and authors from later antiquity are also represented.

Like many volumes arising from conferences, this collection is somewhat lacking in focus; only the figure of Socrates unites the essays, which cannot be said to share an overarching theme or to contribute to a single debate. Nevertheless the volume contains much interesting and stimulating material. In what follows I will comment on a few papers which seemed to me to raise particularly interesting points for discussion, before giving a brief account of the others.

The first two essays both focus on Xenophon’s Socrates. First, Carlo Natali examines the concept of dialectic as presented in the Memorabilia; he finds that dialectic, while it has as a prerequisite the refutation of false claims to knowledge, is itself a source of positive teaching; it aims both at the discovery of definitions, and at distinguishing between good and bad things, for which definition is a precondition. Next, Gerhard Seel compares the versions of Socratic intellectualism found in the Memorabilia and in Plato’s Protagoras; he proposes that Xenophon’s puzzling remarks on this topic can be made coherent by drawing a distinction between akrasia before deliberation, which Xenophon’s Socrates accepts, and akrasia after deliberation, which he rejects; Seel argues that the form of intellectualism here ascribed to Socrates is both intrinsically more plausible than that found in the Protagoras, and more likely to have been Socrates’ own view.

These two papers complement each other; both reveal a Socrates in Xenophon who parallels Plato’s Socrates in important ways, while also having significant differences from him. While I would question some details of Seel’s arguments, I am convinced by him that Xenophon does present Socrates as holding a coherent form of intellectualism, which is nevertheless interestingly different from that of the Protagoras. Natali perhaps overstates the differences between Xenophon’s Socrates, as reconstructed by him, and Plato’s; he holds that the positive purpose of dialectic in Xenophon contrasts with its purely negative purpose in Plato; but it is now widely accepted that Socrates’ dialectic in Plato’s early dialogues has the aim of defending positive doctrine as well as refuting false claims to knowledge (though certainly in Xenophon the positive aim receives greater emphasis). Natali also holds that Xenophon’s explanation of the aim of dialectic as the distinguishing of good and bad things should not be related to Plato’s conception of dialectic, in the Phaedrus and Politicus (and indeed the Republic), as distinguishing things according to their natures. But both conceptions seem to be based on a derivation of ‘dialectic’ from the active verb dialegein, ‘to select’, rather than the middle dialegesthai, ‘to converse’; they may be seen as different ways of developing the same basic idea. Indeed, the kind of distinction which Xenophon’s Socrates seeks, e.g. between the just and the unjust, which is achieved by giving definitions of those terms, can be seen as a special case of the kind of division which Plato’s Socrates aims at, but with an ethical twist which is not so clearly present in Plato. In any case, Natali shows that Xenophon’s Socrates has an interest in refutation, though it is not for him the main purpose of dialectic; and that he resembles Plato’s Socrates in drawing premises for his arguments from his interlocutors’ own views, and in relying on an intellectualist position. All in all, these papers support the view that Xenophon and Plato can be seen as independent witnesses to Socrates, who, as one would expect from witnesses with different outlooks, confirm one another in some ways while differing in others.

Lesley Brown addresses the central argument of the Crito, that Socrates agreed to keep the laws of Athens, and suggests that it turns to a large extent on an equivocation between two senses of ‘agree’: agreement to do something, which is a public act, and agreement that something is the case, which is a private mental state, though it may be manifested in public behaviour. Ostensibly the argument of the personified Laws is concerned with the first — Socrates agreed to keep the laws — but in fact much of what they say relates rather to the second — his behaviour manifested his approval of them, i.e. his agreement that they are good laws. Such confusion between senses of ‘agree’, she suggests, was common in antiquity, and especially attractive in the light of Plato’s emphasis on the inner state of the soul in Socratic dialectic.

I find Brown’s argument convincing; but this paper is especially notable because it manages to engage directly with Socrates in a way that most of the other papers do not; it treats him neither as an object of purely historical interest, nor merely as a starting-point for a modern philosophical inquiry, but as an actual partner in debate, asking ‘Is Socrates right?’. Many still think he is; Brown argues that he is not, but is still able to take his arguments seriously as contributions to the debate. This is clearly not equally possible with all parts of ancient philosophy; but the fact that the issues raised in the Crito are living issues shows that ancient philosophy can still have a direct relevance to our concerns.

David Charles takes up the vexed question of definition in the Socratic dialogues, arguing, with particular reference to the Meno, that two kinds of definition are in play; one, the answer to the question ‘what is x?’, which gives the essence of a kind, and another, the answer to the question ‘what does “x” stand for?’, which simply gives the reference of a general term — the requirements of this latter kind of definition can be satisfied by any uniquely identifying description of the kind in question. However, Charles argues, although Socrates asks both kinds of definitional question, he does not always effectively distinguish between them, and this leads him — and also Plato, in later works — into a number of confusions.

This paper, which develops a theme which Charles has presented elsewhere, will certainly provoke much debate. However, I am unconvinced that there really are two kinds of definition in play in the Socratic dialogues. The question ‘what does “x” stand for?’ is one to which different answers are appropriate according to the context and the interests of the questioner; and certainly a statement of the essence of x can be an appropriate answer to that question; for instance, since the term ‘virtue’ stands for virtue, we can answer the question ‘what does “virtue” stand for?’ by saying what virtue is, i.e. by giving the essence of virtue, saying what it is that makes people or actions virtuous. When Socrates uses language which seems appropriate to the second question, he may, therefore, simply be asking the first question in the formal mode. Charles draws attention to the language which Socrates uses in the Meno in asking for a definition of shape, language which does not reveal any particular interest in essence; but since the definition of shape is requested in order to illuminate what is needed in a definition of virtue, and this question was raised in terms which do imply an interest in essence, Plato may think that the context makes it sufficiently clear that a statement of essence is what is needed.

Charles puts a lot of weight on the definition of shape offered by Socrates as ‘the only thing which always accompanies colour’, pointing out that this does not seem to give the essence of shape, and that Socrates seems prepared to accept it alongside another definition, as ‘limit of a solid’; a thing cannot have two essences, but there can be two ways of stating what a term stands for. However, it is not clear that Socrates is really committed to this definition; he says ‘I would be content (agapōiēn) if you defined virtue in this way’ (Meno 75c1); but agapan is not a strong word, and Socrates may be speaking concessively; ‘if you offered me a definition [even] as good as this one I would be pleased’ [though such a definition would not be wholly satisfactory].

In any case, there is a kind of puzzle as to how we can know at least some uniquely identifying descriptions of a thing without knowing the essence of that thing. How can I know that shape is the only thing which always accompanies colour without knowing what things are shapes? And how can I know that without knowing what they have in common which makes them shapes, i.e. what shape is? Certainly in practice we can pick out shapes without having an essence-giving definition of shape to hand; but it is, I think, a real puzzle how this is possible. (Perhaps the answer lies in a distinction between knowing what shape is and being able to give an account of it — a distinction which Plato’s Socrates, however, would surely have rejected.) Certainly it does not seem that just any uniquely identifying description of shape would be enough to enable us to find examples. Charles suggests that Socrates’ confusion of these two kinds of definition may help to explain the notorious ‘Socratic fallacy’, the claim that we cannot ascribe properties to a thing unless we know its essence. But if Socrates was already convinced of this principle for other reasons, it may itself explain why he sees no need to distinguish between the kinds of definition.

In other papers, Charles H. Kahn discusses the twin themes of hedonism and the denial of akrasia in the Protagoras, making the interesting point that in only that dialogue does Plato’s Socrates actually deny akrasia, i.e. the experience of being overcome by desire for pleasure; while other dialogues include the view that no one knowingly desires bad things — in them the apparent counterexample presented by akrasia is not denied, but ignored. Terence Irwin examines what is often seen as the central argument of Plato’s Euthyphro, the argument that ‘what is loved by all the gods’ cannot be an acceptable definition of piety; he explores the implications of this argument for Plato’s theory of Forms (following the reconstruction of that theory which he has given in other works), and also discusses the revival of the argument in the early modern period by the Cambridge Platonists, Ralph Cudworth and Samuel Clarke.

Vasilis Politis argues that aporia in the Socratic dialogues can stand, not only for a generalised state of perplexity, but also for specific problems and the state of puzzlement about them, which can play an important role in directing investigation. Vassilis Karasmanis discusses the concept of definition in the Meno, arguing that that dialogue is designed to give a systematic account of the nature of definition.

Theodore Scaltsas identifies — what some may find surprising — a metaphysical debate in a Socratic dialogue, the Hippias Major, and uses this as a framework for a discussion of the metaphysics of plural predication, i.e. of cases where we can say ‘A and B are F’ although it is not true that A is F and B is F.

C.C.W. Taylor discusses the relation between Socrates and the sophists, making an interesting case for the view that all the definitions of the sophist in Plato’s dialogue of that name — not just the ‘noble sophist’, who is often seen as a portrait of Socrates — have characteristics in common with Socrates.

John M. Cooper explores the philosophy of Arcesilaus, founder of the ‘sceptical’ Academy, and inquires into the precise nature of his scepticism; the way in which Arcesilaus’ thought reflected that of Socrates is considered, but the main emphasis in the paper is on Arcesilaus himself. Finally, Michael Frede gives an interesting account of the different perceptions of Socrates found in early Christianity, with some writers treating Socrates as a hero and a forerunner of Christianity, others dismissing him as a pagan idolater.

These last two papers give a glimpse of the way in which Socrates continued to have an impact after the time of his pupils, and of the many different ways of perceiving him which have arisen in the history of philosophy. It would have been good if the volume had been able to include other historical views of Socrates — perhaps those of other early Socratics, and of other philosophers from later antiquity, notably the Stoics; only the last section of Terence Irwin’s paper touches on the influence which the figure of Socrates has had on philosophy in the modern period. Nevertheless, this volume does reveal some of the many different ways in which Socrates can be perceived, and shows how he continues to provoke philosophical thought.