Renewing Meaning: A Speech-Act Theoretic Approach

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Stephen Barker, Renewing Meaning: A Speech-Act Theoretic Approach, Oxford University Press, 2004, 364pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199263663.

Reviewed by Michael O'Rourke, University of Idaho


This book is a stalwart attempt to renew meaning understood in terms of speech-acts. It is a sweeping effort, addressing metaphysics and epistemology, philosophy of action and philosophy of mind, and of course, semantics and pragmatics. While I suspect that fans of the more traditional, proposition-based approach to semantics will find much to complain about in this book, it nevertheless represents a significant step forward for speech-act theory and, in my view, for semantics as a whole.

I. The Speech-Act Theoretic Approach: A General Description

In Renewing Meaning, Stephen Barker constructs a view that is situated at the intersection of use-based approaches, where investigations of act types and intentions meet. Meaning is analyzed in terms of act-types, understood as involving cognitive properties, such as believing or intending something. These act-types include illocutionary acts such as assertions, questions, and commands, as well as referring acts at the sub-sentential level. Barker concentrates on the structure of these act-types, building them up out of intentions. The complexity needed to make his Speech-act Theoretic Approach (STA) fit the data is introduced largely at the level of propositional attitudes, although he is quick to assure us that the semantic properties he explains are not simply reproduced at this level. The result is a use-based theory of linguistic meaning on which semantics is "a kind of formal, abstract pragmatics" (63). It is a thoroughly psychological account of meaning that makes no room for traditional semantic elements such as Fregean senses, quantifiers, or propositions. "Semantics," Barker tells us, "is a branch of psychology and cognitive science" (219).

A useful way to introduce a semantic theory is by describing its analyses of meaning, reference, and truth. Meaning, and in particular sentence meaning, is the lead semantic concept for Barker--he begins with it before moving on to other semantic concepts.[1] According to STA, meaning is found in the intentional structure of speech acts. "Meaning is the act itself: the act in which the speaker presents herself as having certain intentions" (74). The basic structure of such an act comprises two intentions, viz., a representational intention and a communicative intention. If a speaker U were to utter, "My coffee is warm," she would typically intend to (a) represent how things stand with her coffee, and (b) communicate this to her audience. As Barker understands it, the latter intention is perlocutionary, focusing on the effect U produces on her audience. The meaning of a sentence, then, is "the act type characteristically performed in uttering the sentence" (64), an act type is individuated in terms of the intentions executed in its performance.

It is against this backdrop that Barker introduces the concepts of reference and truth. Reference is a type of designation, which is the generic relation of language with the world. His concern isn't the abstract relation but rather the activity of referring, understood as the "speech act of making an utterance with the intention that it denote something" (7). Denoting is simply the relation of standing for as it involves sub-sentential items.[2] STA is thus a compositional semantic theory--sentence-level speech acts are built up out of sub-sentential speech acts, such as the act of referring.[3]

Truth is likewise understood relative to meaning. It represents a species of sentence-level evaluation, tied essentially to assertions.[4] On competing accounts, truth is an objective notion that applies to sentences independently of their use. In STA, by contrast, truth is essentially subjective, made out in terms of rational agreement-- listeners will take an utterance to be true just in case they agree with the "assertive commitment properties of utterances" (42). This is a pragmatic conception that fits comfortably into the psychologistic STA.

II. The Speech-Act Theoretic Approach: A Few Details

Barker introduces STA in a philosophically robust fashion. Many semantic theorists attend to meanings of noun phrases, general terms and predicates, or to troublesome data like donkey sentences or sentences involving conventional implicatures. But few worry about all of these, and even fewer attempt to position their theory epistemologically and metaphysically. Barker is one of these few, and for that reason alone his book should get attention--it is a model of how we should conceive our charge as semanticists. There are other reasons, however, as can be seen in even a modest recounting of STA's intricacies.

STA is a complex semantic story built atop a minimalist metaphysics. It accepts a realist ontology of objects, properties, and relations (4). Objects instantiating properties or relations are situations--which he calls complexes-- that are part of the actual world and not "mere possibilia". Complexes and the world they constitute are mereologically and causally complex, but do not exhibit logical complexity; for instance, there are no negative, disjunctive, conjunctive, or conditional facts. "In sum, the world is a fusion of mind-independent, extralinguistic complexes--that is, objects in combination with properties and relations, which lack any logical complexity in re" (5).[5]

Among these properties and relations are cognitive properties and relations, including intendings, which are the structural elements of speech acts. One challenge confronting STA is producing intention-based explanations of speech acts without reproducing the story at the level of intentional content, a move that would obviate any need for the speech-act apparatus. Barker acknowledges this and responds with a hypothetical but nevertheless rich account of cognitive content in Chapters 7 and 8. Intendings and believings are built up out of elements of the natural-representation system (NRS), a system that tracks items in the agent's experience using tracking symbols. These constitute states of the NRS, which fix the content of cognitive states, and in particular, intentions.[6] Barker devotes most of Chapter 7 to an analysis of the representational and communicative intentions in terms of the NRS. In order to make our complicated linguistic practice fit the minimal resources of the NRS, Barker attributes to agents dispositions to follow repertoire rules that govern use of linguistic items. A natural language user will trigger these causal dispositions when she desires to communicate, and the NRS together with these dispositions will structure her contribution to the discourse. Barker argues that STA avoids reproduction concerns because it arises out of a spare, naturalistic account of representation in terms of causation that gives rise to semantic complexity as an emergent phenomenon.

From here, we move to the semantic story, which is the main business of Parts I and II, with Part IV devoted to establishing that STA is superior to the Fregean approach as an explanation for subtle data involving the behavior of noun phrases in general contexts. Previously, we introduced the structure of a typical speech act--it involves both representational and communicative components. Barker complicates this structure in two important ways. First, he concentrates not on speech-acts, but on what he calls proto-acts. A proto-act is "an act in which a speaker U utters a string, be it a sentence, term, or predicate, and presents herself as having an intention" (7); possession of presented intentions is a different part of the story. These, and not speech acts proper, are what fix meanings in STA. The difference is grounded in the idea of presenting or advertising intentions. One advertises an intention if and only if one "intentionally goes through the behavior characteristic of someone who, following certain rules, has that … intention" (7). The rules here are repertoire rules, which codify the conventional powers of words to aid speakers in achieving their designational purposes. Thus, Barker breaks a typical speech act down into two parts: the advertised-intentions part and the intentions-possession part. This enables him to accommodate a variety of act-types that involve advertising intentions one does not have.

While STA extends naturally to cover all illocutionary acts, assertion serves as the primary staging ground. In producing the proto-act "S is P," U advertises a representational intention, viz., the intention to represent the complex , and a communicative intention, viz., the intention to defend commitment to the representational cognitive property communicated by the utterance, i.e., the representational intention.[7] "Defend commitment" is cashed out in perlocutionary terms: one "defends a commitment to a cognitive property Π¸ … if and only if (i) the audience H believes she, U, possesses a commitment to Π; and (ii) H either accepts, confirms, or rejects a commitment to Π¸ in her own case" (8).

To this standard form, Barker introduces two important elements, viz., the reportive/expressive distinction and modes of interpretation. An assertion can either report how things stand with the world, or it can express a cognitive state of the speaker, where these are grammatically determined by the sentences used. When we engage in the latter sort of speech act, we engage in a reflexive act that introduces our cognitive attitude toward a topic, an attitude possession of which we are willing to defend. An expressive assertion conveys information about the world and about us, through our representation of the world.[8] We have been discussing reportive assertions, but many if not most of the utterances we make are expressive according to STA. Indeed, it supplies an expressive semantics for any assertive utterance containing modal auxiliaries, adverbs of generality, logical connectives, universal noun phrases, and assertions of truth, existence, and identity. STA implies that natural language, as a medium, conveys as much or more about its users than about the world at large.

Modes of interpretation provide additional semantic flexibility. These are exhibited by utterances in which a speaker advertises certain representational and communicative intentions but lacks them, intending the proto-act to be interpreted by the audience in some other way. Non-assertoric illocutionary proto-acts can be performed under modes, as can sub-sentential proto-acts, such as proto-referring acts.[9] With modes, Barker can take the standard form of proto-acts and extend it to cover cases in which the surface grammar suggests one thing while the speaker is doing another. Among other proto-acts, modes allow STA to accommodate irony and sarcasm, metaphor, conventional implicature, and universal generality. Together with the expressive/reportive distinction, modes enable Barker to extend the standard structure of proto-acts to cover an impressive variety of linguistic data in a way that is compositional and generally consistent with surface grammar.

III. Admiring the Virtues

Barker devotes parts of Chapters 0, 1, and 10 to criticism of Fregean approaches in contemporary semantics that privilege reference and quantification, and with them propositions and correspondence truth. For rhetorical purposes, this makes good sense--Barker advocates a speech-act approach that flies in the face of many received, sacrosanct opinions. (Who wouldn't make room for quantification in their story of generality, for example?) But this work is more constructive than critical. STA will ultimately stand or fall on its own virtues, so most of the book is devoted to championing them.

The virtues explicitly claimed for the view are many: STA does not require an elaborate metaphysics, it does not imply that any two sentences conveying the same information must have the same truth conditions, and it provides unified accounts of descriptive noun phrases, 'if'-sentences, and anaphoric pronouns, to name just a few. Three virtues stand out. First, there are those who argue that perlocutionary accounts of assertion require too much of the listener, in that they require her to believe certain things as a result of a speech act.[10] However, STA avoids this charge by requiring only that the listener accept or reject the representational commitment presented in the speech act.

Second, speech act theories often run afoul of the semantic dogma that the meanings of larger linguistic items (e.g., sentences, discourses) must be built up out of the meanings of their parts, but not STA. Sentence meaning, given by proto-act types, is built up out of proto-referring acts and predication understood as incomplete proto-assertion (67). Further, it makes proto-acts, not full-blown speech acts, the currency of semantic exchange, enabling him to accommodate more complicated data through modes of interpretation.[11]

Finally, there is the status of surface grammar. Every new student of philosophy of language knows Russell's "On Denoting", and they know it as a triumph of philosophical analysis. Without philosophy, we would still be searching the streets of Paris for a king. But this analysis and many others show little respect for surface grammar. Surely a view that could explain the data while cleaving to surface grammar would be superior to a view implying that immediately available grammatical cues are fundamentally misleading, and STA is such a view. "The grammar of an expression E," he contends, "is never in conflict with its meaning" (19). With language, according to STA, what you see is what you get, at least most of the time.

IV. A Fregean Responds

This challenging book renews my faith in the possibility of a workable speech-act semantics, one that takes intention and action as its starting points and does justice to the complexity of natural language. But STA comes at a cost that will seem too high for many defenders of the Fregean faith. Barker renounces the semantic centrality of propositions, rejects quantification as the vehicle for explaining generality, and warmly embraces subjectivism about truth and psychologism about semantics. Any one of these is likely a deal breaker, let alone all of them.

Of course, this is not really Barker's problem. He has developed a semantic theory with broad explanatory reach that is both metaphysically parsimonious and naturalistic. While it can be cause for concern, sticker shock is no argument. How can a Fregean respond? While impressive, STA is not invulnerable. First, there is the presumption that proposition-based approaches cannot handle the range of cases accommodated by STA. Barker contends that on the Fregean approach, two declarative sentences must agree in their truth conditions if they convey the same information about "how things are" (29). But this is false--there are several proposition-based views that deny this, foremost among these being Perry's Reflexive-Referential Theory.[12] Further, the orthodox view need not stumble over conventional implicatures and logical particles if total interpretations are constructed out of semantic and pragmatic elements on-line and in parallel.[13] Even the views criticized in Chapter 10 live to see another day--they struggle with double-bind problems, but it is never established that this is endemic to the approach.

But most of Renewing Meaning is devoted to constructive theorizing, not criticism. What can be said about this? I am left with many questions from my study of the work, of which I will raise two. First, STA implies that many of our utterances are as much about us as they are about the world. Consider my utterance of the sentence, "It is probably raining." This is expressive because of the presence of a modal adverb, so in uttering it I advertise the intentions to (a) represent a complex, believes it is raining> and (b) defend commitment to possession of this belief. My utterance is essentially reflexive, introducing my beliefs as the primary focus. Indeed, it would appear as though I can be accused of saying more about myself than the rain. The topic may still be the rain, but my intentions are centered on my cognitive states. If most of my utterances are expressive, as suggested above, doesn't this imply that I spend most of my time talking about myself? Surely this is more reductio than result. Second, Barker insists that STA avoids reproduction worries because it depends on a very spare representation system that does not reproduce the full contents of speech acts, in particular the communicative intention.[14] But as he goes on to argue, the intentional components of a speech act are explained in terms of the NRS, so surely we can repeat the question, viz., why can we not reproduce the meaning of a speech act, understood in terms of representational and communicative intentions, at the level of tracking states? The reduction he defends would appear to resurrect the bogey of reproduction.

Questions and concerns notwithstanding, this is an outstanding book, one that represents more than a decade of careful reflection on the details of semantic theory. While I doubt many in the orthodox community will be moved to convert, they will certainly be moved to reflect, and that is about all you can ask from a book as contrary as this one. It may not renew meaning, but it should renew interest in speech act theory. I hope that Renewing Meaning receives the attention it deserves--semantics would be the better for it.

[1] While Barker concentrates on sentence-level utterances, this should not be taken to imply that he endorses the view that words and other sub-sentential units only have meaning in the context of sentences. Barker explicitly rejects this view--see p. 114 n. 7.

[2] As such, it is equivalent in character if not application to the relation of representation, which is standing for as it involves sentences. Both denotation and representation are species of designation, which is "an intention-dependent relation." In Barker's view, "It is because speakers use sentences and words with certain intentions, and the world is a certain way, that speakers' sentences or words designate various world-parts" (5).

[3] This act-type is construed much more broadly in STA than in the standard Frege-inspired theory, covering what the latter reserves for quantification theory.

[4] Other illocutionary acts, such as questions and commands, are not in general regarded as truth-apt. The rhetorical question is an exception. See p. 58 for Barker's discussion.

[5] These restrictions are limiting, forcing complexity to be introduced at the level of speech act structure.

[6] Intentions have two parts: a "pure intentional" part that aims to modify the world to fit the state, and a "doxastic tracking" part that aims to keep the state in touch with the world, both of which are made out in terms of the NRS (193).

[7] Non-assertive illocutionary acts are distinguished from assertive ones through the communicative intention, which focuses on making the listener believe that the speaker possesses a certain type of desire, rather than on the defense of a commitment. See pp. 81ff.

[8] When we perform an expressive speech act, we are not simply announcing that we have a certain cognitive stateÑthat would be to issue a report. Compare "I believe that Chelsea will win" to "Chelsea will probably win." The former is a report about my beliefs, whereas the latter is an expression of them. In the former, I advertise intentions to (a) represent my beliefs, and (b) defend my commitment to this representation. In the latter, I advertise intentions to (a) represent a complex of the form the belief that Chelsea will win>, and (b) defend my commitment to possession of that belief. The topic of the former sentence is my belief, whereas the topic of the latter is Chelsea's prospects. Nevertheless, I am not simply reporting those prospects; rather, I am conveying them through the lens provided by my beliefs. For more on expressives, see Chs. 0 and 1, especially pp. 10-13 and 39-42.

[9] Examples of the former include rhetorical questions and non-assertoric declaratives, whereas the latter include proto-referring acts involving universal noun phrases, which are interpreted under a variable mode according to STA. See pp. 57-8 and 155-8.

[10] For the critical view, see Alston, W. P. (2000). Illocutionary Acts and Sentence Meaning. Ithaca, NY: Cornell. For the criticized views, see Grice, H. P. (1957). "Meaning." Philosophical Review, 66: 377-88, and Schiffer, S. (1972). Meaning. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

[11] The compositional power of STA is in full bloom in Chapter 11, where generality and anaphora are explained for both intrasentential and intersentential data.

[12] See Perry, J. (2001). Reference and Reflexivity. Stanford: CSLI Publications. Among other comparative advantages, this view appears to supply the resources to accommodate the insights Barker builds into expressive speech acts.

[13] See O'Rourke, M. (2003). "The Scope Argument." The Journal of Philosophy, 100:136-57