Renewing Philosophy of Religion: Exploratory Essays

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Paul Draper and J. L. Schellenberg (eds.), Renewing Philosophy of Religion: Exploratory Essays, Oxford University Press, 2017, 242 pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198738909.

Reviewed by Adam Green, Azusa Pacific University


"A traveller of good judgment may mistake his way, and be unawares led into a wrong track . . . but when it ends in a coal-pit, it requires no great judgment to know that he hath gone wrong, nor perhaps to find out what had misled him." -Thomas Reid, An Inquiry into the Human Mind

The editors and authors of this volume think that philosophy of religion is in a coal pit that Christian analytic philosophers have been merrily digging for us with confessional work better suited to theology. The contributors disagree over how exactly we've gone wrong, how seriously we've gone wrong, and what charting a better route would look like. They are all in agreement, however, that philosophy of religion desperately needs to change. There is much that is of interest in the thirteen essays of this volume, but within the context of this short review, I will survey only a representative selection of the offerings. It is with regret that I pass over the contributions of John Bishop, Clare Carlisle, Robert McKim, Wes Morriston, Graham Oppy, J. Aaron Simmons, and Mark Wynn. For the essays below, I will convey the upshot of the piece along three dimensions -- what they say is wrong with contemporary philosophy of religion, how bad this fault is, and what the alternative is that the author recommends in response.

In "Rescuing Religion From Faith," Sonia Sikka claims that what is wrong with philosophy of religion is that its disproportionate focus on Christianity has obscured the fact that religion need not and probably should not be shackled to faith. In this context, faith seems to be construed as a non-negotiable commitment to creedal truths definitive of a religious position. From a more global perspective emphasizing various eastern viewpoints, Sikka finds more of an emphasis on process, dialogue, and open-ended debate than on defending and unpacking the proverbial deposit of faith. Philosophy of religion should empower people to explore their options rather than starting with a certain set of answers portrayed as authoritative.

In "Global Philosophy of Religion and Its Challenges," Yujin Nagasawa draws on Ninian Smart and John Hick to outline a program for doing global philosophy of religion. For Nagasawa, the problem with contemporary philosophy of religion isn't necessarily that what is being done is bad, as contrasted with Sikka's claims about the pernicious influence of faith. Rather, the work isn't bad; it's blinkered. Philosophers of religion work within their own tradition without paying much attention to the insights of any other, and this applies to more than just Christian philosophers. As opposed to older pluralistic projects like Hick's, Nagasawa's proposal is more methodologically than theoretically pluralistic. He doesn't want to force anyone to assume anything about how different religions relate to each other and what the relative status of different religions is vis-à-vis the truth. Rather, he stresses the importance of thinking about topics in the philosophy of religion in a multi-faceted way by bringing different global perspectives to bear on philosophical problems.

In "Against Ultimacy," Stephen Maitzen urges that the problem with contemporary philosophy of religion is that the idea that there is any sort of ultimate reality is incoherent. There is nothing ultimate ontologically, axiologically, or teleologically. Though he has various ways of applying it in his different sub-arguments, his over-arching idea seems to be that philosophers of religion fail to see that degreed properties don't imply an actual upper bound that maximizes the value in question. He appeals to mathematics by way of analogy. The set of real numbers, for instance, doesn't need to contain some particular highest number that maximizes numerical value. The series of numbers just goes on forever, and the application of numbers from the series to the real world doesn't imply that numbers higher up in the series are actually instantiated. Once we get over our concern with ultimacy, philosophy can provide us with all the transcendence we need by allowing us to transcend ordinary ways of thinking, and we can do that without ultimacy. Thus, in essence, for Maitzen, the philosophy of religion should be assimilated into philosophy proper.

In "Religion After Naturalism," Eric Steinhart thinks that philosophy of religion has gotten stuck because its conception of religion sets it against naturalism. As more and more people come to realize that naturalism is true, philosophy of religion is in danger of fading away much like theorizing about outdated science (e.g. no one bothers doing the philosophy of phlogiston). Once one realizes that there can be naturalistic religions, whether they be centered on energy, drugs, raves, or art festivals, we can make space for a philosophy of religion that survives the triumph of naturalism. In fact, "philosophers can become actively involved in designing new religions" (75) as well as critiquing them. Thus, while Sikka and Nagasawa's critiques both push in the direction of a globally representative philosophy of religion, we see that other contributors like Maitzen and Steinhart recommend abandoning all or almost all existing forms of religion in favor of alternatives.

In "North American Philosophers of Religion: How They See Their Field," we get a rather different kind of essay from Wesley J. Wildman and David Rohr. They did an empirical study based on fifty-one solicited blog entries on the topic "What is philosophy of religion?" By and large, the results of the study tend to confirm that there is a deep division between how at least two groups approach the field. To the extent that a given philosopher of religion teaches at a confessional religious school and is a member of the Society of Christian Philosophers, they will approach philosophy of religion more narrowly and confessionally. To the extent that one teaches at a secular school, is a member of the American Academy of Religion, and teaches in a religious studies department, one will approach the field in a more global, inclusive manner. Mixing those categories or falling outside of those categories produces more mixed results (e.g. religious schools that don't require statements of faith or persons who are members of the American Philosophical Association but not the SCP or the AAR). The essay provides some evidence that the sentiments of the contributors to this volume are representative of a larger class of people.

Finally, Jason Marsh pens the essay that perhaps most focally expresses a charge against contemporary philosophy of religion that runs throughout the contributions to the volume. In "On the Socratic Injunction to Follow the Argument Where It Leads," Marsh pits G.E. Moore and Socrates against each other in a struggle over what philosophy should be that is as much tempermental and aspirational as it is a dispute about particular philosophical claims. In essence, Moore and the Moorean stack the deck against philosophical innovation by requiring that philosophy's claims vindicate themselves before the tribunal of our antecedent commitments. Even Socrates needs starting points from which to reason and endorses some limits to legitimate inquiry like non-contradiction. The Moorean, however, makes it too easy to decide not to follow the evidence where it leads. It may be, for Marsh, that the Moorean approach is an acceptable hedge to put between us and skepticism about widely accepted claims of common sense such as that there is an external world. To be Moorean about religious claims, however, which do not command the same sort of consensus and are debated by reasonable persons, strikes Marsh as philosophically perverse. He singles out Alvin Plantinga and William Lane Craig for special castigation on this score. Thus, however the field is to proceed, it should do so more in the spirit of Socrates than of Moore.

In considering the volume as a whole, it is helpful to situate the animating concern of the contributors against familiar debates over the relationship between naturalism and science on the one hand and on the other hand against debates over public reason's role in disputes about fairness and the common good.

Consider the debate over whether there is something wrong with the idea of theistic science and whether methodological naturalism is neutral as between different worldviews. Proponents of methodological naturalism, whether theists or naturalists, often hold that we change the nature of what we are doing when we insert metaphysical claims about God's existence (or non-existence) into a discussion of natural phenomena. Whereas before we were doing biology, say, once we bring the idea of a creator into play we aren't doing biology anymore. Rather, we've taken up biological data into theological or atheological discourse. Methodological naturalist might think there is something dodgy or under-handed about trying to insert over-arching worldview concerns into a scientific discussion, but they need not. They might simply think that science of its nature has to bracket such considerations in virtue of what science is and that people who want to play rowdy worldview games should take them outside out of the laboratory.

In like manner, the various contributors have a problem with philosophy of religion being methodologically confessional. That approach seems partisan to them. It doesn't allow the philosophy of religion to have an integrity as a discipline that sets it apart from the special concerns of religious (or perhaps anti-religious) interest groups. Consequently, the contributors are reaching for a more principled, objective methodology that can be put in its place. They disagree over what that would look like. A number of them think that a more globally representative methodology would do the trick. Others want a more formal apparatus to guide the method, as with Oppy's piece (which we did not canvas). Still others like Steinhart would have us adopt a method which assumes some form of naturalism, perhaps in a way analogous to those who think methodological naturalism in science implies metaphysical naturalism.

Turning to our second parallel, in a pluralistic society in which one group has more power than the others, we get a familiar tension. The dominant group may have interests that are not shared by the rest of society and that may directly or indirectly impinge on the interests of other groups. If everyone pursues their own interests without any regulatory framework within which to situate those pursuits, then there is, of course, reason to think the dominant group will win out whenever its interests conflict with those of others. This, of course, raises concerns about fairness and the viability of pursuing a common good that covers all the members of society. And so it is in the case of the philosophy of religion.

The legacies of Plantinga and the other founders of the Society of Christian Philosophers include not just their own substantial works but also the way they inspired successive generations of young Christians to pursue careers in philosophy (and this reviewer is one of the throng). The figure of the covert apologist using reason as a tool to coerce others recurs in this volume, but I think that obscures the more representative phenomenon. The field of philosophy of religion is full of Christians of one stripe or another who are interested in thinking through philosophical questions that touch on their faith. They do so because there are a lot of such philosophical questions to think about and because their faith is deeply enmeshed with what they value and how they answer the perennial questions of philosophy. They would be overjoyed if they convinced anyone else to agree with them, but I would wager that the typical Christian philosopher does not even think that coerced faith is the genuine article. They certainly defend their positions and could stand to improve on turning the other check when they feel attacked. I don't see why any of that makes a Christian philosopher an apologist in the pejorative sense used in contexts like this, though we could all nominate a philosopher or two for the epithet. After all, if by apologist we were just to mean someone who defends their views in a public arena, then all philosophers would qualify.

Even if the critic does not impugn the integrity of the typical Christian philosopher, the concerns about fairness and the common good don't go away. If there is a glut of Christian philosophers in the field, there will be more articles, monographs, and anthologies on topics particular to Christianity like resurrection and atonement and work on more broadly applicable topics like the problem of evil or the religious aspects of human flourishing will be tilted in the direction of how Christians and their antagonists think about such topics. It may be harder to publish, promote, and gain appropriate disciplinary recognition for work that falls outside of the dialogical frameworks set up by a Christian dominated field.

Once again, the perspectives of the volume differ on what should be done in response, and they align with familiar options for dealing with the related problematics from social and political philosophy. On the one hand, one could try to institute confession-neutral criteria for participation in the philosophy of religion. Many of the contributors would like any work on a Christian topic or work from an obviously Christian perspective to be pushed out of philosophy into (Christian) theology. On this proposal, something will only count as a legitimate piece of philosophy of religion if it is confessionally neutral. Others don't want people's thick religious identities bracketed or excluded in this manner. A second proposal would have us more intentionally promote a diverse range of voices within philosophy of religion, boosting minority voices in the discipline rather than promoting neutrality. As with Nagasawa's piece, this second option could include the encouragement of projects diverse people have reason to value from within their religious or areligious identities.

But what should the takeaway be if you are a Christian philosopher and you think that Christianity is true? Many Christians hold that other religious and areligious perspectives are important sources of truth. It seems pretty easy to see how such a point could be parlayed into a reason to dialogue seriously with the more globalist proposals in the book. It's a little harder to see how a Christian's response to the Maitzen's of the world could take any form other than an attempted rebuttal. At the very least, this volume offers Christians like myself an opportunity for reflection in light of the discontent expressed within it. Other would be contributors to philosophy of religion find us inhospitable, ignorant, biased, and insufficiently curious. We should try very hard not to be any of those things.