Reparations: Interdisciplinary Inquiries

Placeholder book cover

Jon Miller and Rahul Kumar (eds.), Reparations: Interdisciplinary Inquiries, Oxford University Press, 2007, 368pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199299911.

Reviewed by Bernard Boxill, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill


This book is a collection of thirteen essays on various aspects of the contemporary demands for reparations made by oppressed peoples, ex-colonies, African Americans, and dispossessed nations. Jeremy Waldron, Rebecca Tsosie, and Janna Thompson each have an essay on reparations for indigenous peoples; Glenn Loury, Andrew Valls, and Carolyn Benson contribute three essays on reparations for Jim Crow laws and slavery in the U.S.; Pablo de Greiff, Debra Satz, and Catherine Lu provide essays on the general idea of reparations for conflict; and Rajeev Bhargava, Brandon Hamber, and Kok-Chor-Tan round out the collection with essays on reparations for colonialism. Elazar Barkan provides an introduction and Yael Danieli a conclusion.

All the essays make interesting reading, but among the most rewarding, I think, are those by Benson, Bhargava, and Valls. Benson demonstrates the complexity of the reparative project. By extending and clarifying the work of Elizabeth Spelman and others, she shows that race and gender are not isolable factors when considering matters like discrimination because how one is treated as a man or as a woman depends on one's racial identity. Bhargava gives an extended and detailed analysis of the idea of cultural injustices of colonialism. The analysis is mostly focused on India although Bhargava makes useful references to the cultural injustices of colonialism in Africa in order to demonstrate that the cultural injustices of colonialism were not always the same in all the European colonies. The whole treatment is judicious, extraordinarily well informed, and persuasive. Valls, who seems to be the only contributor to the volume with an awareness that reparation was vigorously discussed and debated in the 70's and 80's, provides in his unfortunately far too short essay a brilliant review of four main sources of misunderstanding in the debate over black reparations in the U.S. Some of these -- especially the ideas that black reparations are only about reparations for slavery, that focusing on black reparations is a strategic error, and that forward looking egalitarian theories take precedence over backward looking arguments for black reparations -- are committed by several contributors to the volume, and I recommend that they read Valls's chapter carefully.

Also worthy of special note is Loury's contribution in which he distinguishes racial stigma from racial discrimination, though I must say that he has explained the distinction and its implications better in some of his other work. Similarly, particularly noteworthy is Kok-Chor Tan's contribution on colonialism, reparations, and global justice. With characteristic clarity Tan focuses on the claims for reparations independent sovereign nations have on account of their past colonial subjection. He demonstrates that such claims can supplement and substitute for claims made on the basis of egalitarian considerations.

Unfortunately, however, even Tan falls prey to a line of arguments that has stymied many a defender of reparations. I am referring to the arguments against reparations pressed by Waldron which appear in his contribution to this volume as well as in earlier essays. The particular argument that Tan concedes is that counterfactual arguments for reparations are "too indeterminate" to play an important role in the case for reparations for individuals. He therefore reformulates his claim so that the claims are made on behalf of a nation rather than on behalf of individuals. But he fails to consider seriously enough the difficulties in the idea of a nation playing the role he wants it to play. Further, his concession seems to undercut claims for reparation to African Americans unless they are considered to be a nation. Only Valls and Thompson in her fine essay on reparation for the Aborigines of Australia in which she takes up some general issues on the idea of reparation seem to offer any resistance to Waldron's arguments. In the remainder of this essay I will therefore try to show that these arguments are far less compelling than many of the contributors to this volume seem to think.

Like everything that Waldron has written, his essay in this collection is lucid, learned, and persuasive. He maintains that claims for reparations for the indigenous peoples of New Zealand and Australia (the Maori and the Aborigines) face a "dilemma." (page 35) Either these claims argue that the Maori and the Aborigines were the first human inhabitants of the territories in question and therefore deserve reparation from the European settlers, or they argue that the Maori and the Aborigines were in the territories before the European settlers and therefore deserve reparation from them. Waldron maintains that both arguments fail. The first fails because it relies on a philosophically unacceptable principle, namely the "Principle of First Occupancy." The second fails because it appeals to the human interest in stability, security, certainty, and peace, and accordingly gives the Established Order a "prima facie" right to be left undisturbed irrespective of how it came about.

But this "dilemma" is not a dilemma at all. Take its second horn. The alleged problem is that the Principle of Established Order functions to protect not only "violently established arrangements in 1839," but also "violently established arrangements in 2005." (page 35) Too quickly Waldron concludes that it therefore rebuffs demands for reparation. As he himself admits, the Principle of Established Order only gives a prima facie right to an established distribution of property and sovereignty to be left undisturbed. (page 31) It could therefore with perfect consistency rule that the arrangements in 2005 should be disturbed and that the arrangements in 1839 should not have been disturbed. Such a ruling would not be unreasonable. The violence and injustice that established the arrangements in 1839 could not possibly match the violence and injustice that established the arrangements in 2005. The illusion of a difficulty is created only by outrageously though subtly equating the disruption and injustice the Europeans caused the Maori and the Aborigines with the disruption that would be caused by making reparation to them.

The first horn of the alleged dilemma also crumbles on examination. The Principle of First Occupancy is supposed to be unacceptable because the first people to occupy a territory must share their land with others if a time comes when these others "have no place else to go." In an earlier paper Waldron illustrates the difficulty with the well known water hole example. ("Superseding Historical Injustice," Ethics, Volume 103, 1992) When water holes are available a group may take possession of a water hole and justly exclude others from using it. If water becomes scarce, however, the group must share its water hole with the others, "notwithstanding the legitimacy of their original appropriation." He then complicates his example apparently to make it closer to the case of the European seizure of the lands of indigenous peoples. Suppose, he says, the members of a group Q motivated purely by greed descended on group P's water hole and insisted on "sharing" it with them. Although Waldron concedes that this would be an injustice, he maintains that if all the other water holes dried up, the members of Q would be entitled to "share" it with P. (page 25)

Obviously Waldron is suggesting that although the Europeans acted unjustly when they first arrived and "shared" the land with the natives, they now act justly when they insist on "sharing" the land with the natives. But his use of the word "share" to describe what the Europeans did when they arrived in Australia and New Zealand elides their brutality and injustice. And his use of the same word to describe what the Europeans are entitled to when land becomes scarce, though correctly implying that they are entitled to something, elides the issue of what they are entitled to. When our attentions are thus diverted from the brutality of the Europeans' occupation, and from the question of how much they are entitled to now, we may be induced to assume, without asking why, that natives and Europeans are entitled to equal shares of the land. This assumption would perhaps be acceptable if it could generally be claimed that land owners must share their land equally with new comers when scarcity sets in, but Waldron makes no attempt to defend that claim. And even if it were defensible, it would still not follow that natives and Europeans were entitled to equal shares. This is because despite Waldron's use of the palliative word "share" to describe the Europeans' original behavior, they remain brutal thieves even in the later conditions of scarcity when they are entitled to something and even perhaps to equal shares. This follows from Waldron's own argument. If, as he argues, the members of Q acted unjustly (and I infer were, consequently, thieves) when they "shared" P's water hole when water was not scarce, the fact that they are now entitled to share P's water hole because water is scarce does not change the fact that they were thieves when earlier they drank water from the well when they were not entitled to because water was not scarce. And, barring some deep change in their characters, they remain thieves even when they are entitled to drink from P's well. (See Angelo Corlett's Race Racism and Reparations page 180 for a similar point.) A thief does not become an honest man just because circumstances change and he no longer steals to satisfy his wants; neither does the change imply that he gains absolution for his crimes. He may still justly be punished.

Similarly since Waldron admits that up to the point of scarcity the Europeans unjustly occupied the lands in question, he must admit -- barring the implausible excuse that they did not know what they were doing -- that they were thieves, and consequently that they remain thieves unless they have repented and changed their characters. And even if they have done these things and are no longer inclined to steal (and consequently, let us grant, are no longer thieves) it does not follow that they are not responsible for their past crimes. Waldron seems oblivious to these consequences of his own presentation of the arguments for reparation based on the Principle of First Occupancy, thus understating their force and leaving the wariness of the natives in having Europeans in positions of power over them unexplained.

It may seem that these considerations only strengthen Waldron's claim that backward looking demands of reparation endanger the forward looking egalitarian demands of justice. But this danger is less serious than his claim makes it seem unless we are given a detailed account of the egalitarian demands of forward looking considerations. For example, these considerations do not demand that property be divided equally. They demand equality of opportunity, but equality of opportunity, even what Rawls calls "fair equality of opportunity," is apparently consistent with considerable inequality in wealth and property. Further, the claim depends on unfairly and inconsistently dismissing the importance of the past. We have already seen an example of this dependence in Waldron's failure to notice that his criticism of the argument for reparation based on the Principle of First Occupancy fails to hold the Europeans responsible for their past unjust actions. His tendency to dismiss the past and its effects reveals itself in a different way in his complaint that counterfactual arguments for reparation are too indeterminate when applied to individuals to be much use. Consider, for example, his claim that there is a "fragility" in "historic record" consisting in the "sheer contingency of what happened in the past," in the fact that "this happened rather than that -- that people were massacred (though they need not have been), that lands were taken (though they might have been bought fairly)," and that "What happened might have been otherwise." (page 5) If history is as Waldron claims to see it, all counterfactual arguments for reparation can be dismissed with the question "Who knows how the victims of injustice might have fared had the injustice not occurred?" But human history is not a series of surprises in which every event is unpredictable because human beings have free will and might have chosen to do something other than what they did choose to do. It would be this way perhaps if human beings did not have (inculcated by culture and their own previous behavior) pasts, characters, vices and virtues all of which strongly dispose them to act in one way rather than in another. There is for example no "fragility" in the historic record of the events that followed Columbus's arrival in the New World, nor any "sheer contingency in what happened." Given the kind of man Columbus was and the kind of men that would follow him -- arrogant, daring, cruel, powerful, and greedy -- the fate of the natives was sealed.

Waldron is aware of the implausibility of his contingency of history thesis at least if it is taken in a sense strong enough to support his resistance to reparation. He tries to prop it up by arguing that though we make predictions about how people will exercise their freedom, even our best predictions lack "moral authority" in the case of reparations. (page 10) He means, I suppose, that we lack the moral authority to redistribute property in the way which claims for reparations for an injustice might demand even if they are based on our best predictions of what would have happened had the injustice not happened. To illustrate his point he reminds us that a woman's decision to leave her property to a home for stray dogs "carries the day" even when the best evidence available indicated that she would leave her property to Amnesty International. This example shows us that our best estimate of another's decision must give way to her actual decision; but it has little relevance to reparations arguments since we have no signed and written statement from the victims of injustice that what was owed them should go to homes for stray dogs! Waldron's further criticisms (e.g., that the rights of victims of injustice to entitlements for harms fade with time and that individual victims may have lost their entitlements in poker games) ignore what defenders of reparation have been saying. (page 15) Thus, while they admit that slavery ended some time ago, they point out that Jim Crow practices that began since the ending of slavery have kept its harms fresh and consequently have prevented claims for reparation from fading. The poker game objection relies on the same tendency to dismiss the past that we have already noted. The historical record indicates that most of the victims of past injustice now demanding reparation were men and women of strong character who tried hard to succeed against overwhelming odds. Who gave Waldron the "moral authority" to deny that majority their just entitlements simply because a few others were bad poker players who would have gambled away their holdings?

I am a little embarrassed for spending so much time on Waldron's criticisms of reparation arguments, though there is still a lot more to be said about them. But I think the time spent rebutting them is justified because their gloomy conclusions hang like a pall over this excellent set of papers.