Replacing Truth

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Kevin Scharp, Replacing Truth, Oxford University Press, 2013, 325pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199653850.

Reviewed by David Ripley, University of Connecticut


In the first half or so of this book, Kevin Scharp argues first that the concept of truth (understood here as one whose constitutive principles, taken together, have some false consequences (p. 36)) is inconsistent; second that it is thereby unsuitable for use in 'serious theorizing' (p. 134); and finally that it should be replaced with (consistent) successor concepts designed to be able to do the theoretical work we want truth to do. He devotes the remainder of the book to the presentation, discussion, and deployment of a particular pair of such successor concepts, which he dubs ascending truth and descending truth.

Chapter 1 quickly surveys the vast philosophical literature on truth, dividing it into two camps: 'philosophical approaches', which focus on the nature of truth itself, and 'logical approaches', which focus on developing formal systems and are typically paradox-focused. Chapter 2 presents a theory of inconsistent concepts. These are concepts with some false constitutive principles; what it is for a principle to be constitutive for a concept is of course also considered. (For Scharp, it is for possessors of the concept to have default (and defeasible) entitlement to the principle.)

Chapters 3 and 4 begin the turn to truth in particular, and make the case that truth is an inconsistent concept. Chapter 3 focuses on what Scharp calls 'the obvious argument' for truth's inconsistency: the argument to contradiction based on the liar paradox. This requires that truth obey the familiar T-schema Tφ〉↔ φ for all sentences φ (in particular, for the liar sentence itself), where T is the truth predicate and〈φ〉is a name of φ. Scharp divides the T-schema into its component principles Tφ〉→ φ (which I'll call 'release') and φ → Tφ〉(which I'll call 'capture'), and argues, based in part on their crucial role in truth's use as a device of endorsement, that these principles are constitutive for the concept truth. 'The obvious argument' also depends on the reasoning in the familiar argument to contradiction being valid, and he argues for this claim as well (I will return to this below). Chapter 4 offers additional arguments for truth's inconsistency, all based around the phenomenon of revenge.

Chapter 5 starts from the idea that truth is an inconsistent concept, and argues that it should therefore be replaced, at least for some purposes. This involves discussion of, and arguments against, other theories of truth that hold it to be inconsistent but do not recommend replacing it.

Chapter 6 begins the constructive project of the book; in it Scharp develops what he calls the 'prescriptive theory' of truth. This is where the replacements that Scharp commends to us -- which he calls 'ascending truth' and 'descending truth' (on which more below) -- are developed and explored. Chapter 7 turns to reflections on methodology. Here Scharp spells out what he calls 'metrological naturalism', a Davidson-inspired approach to philosophical methodology that helps us see how to use particular concepts without offering an analysis of them (in this case, applied to ascending truth and descending truth).

In Chapter 8 Scharp considers a number of the theoretical uses truth serves for us, in theories of proof, objectivity, meaning, reference, etc., and argues that ascending and descending truth can serve these purposes as well. This is crucial to his overall project; if ascending and descending truth cannot serve these purposes, then replacing truth with them would be no better than simply throwing truth away and stopping there. In the course of this chapter, Scharp adapts a particular style of truth-conditional semantics (which I'll abbreviate TCS) for natural languages (based on Predelli 2005) to the present setting, converting it to ascending-truth-and-descending-truth-conditional semantics (which I'll abbreviate ATDTCS).

In Chapter 9 Scharp turns to 'descriptive theory' -- how are we to understand what ordinary speakers mean when they claim that something is true? (And more generally, how are we to understand ordinary uses of inconsistent concepts?) Here Scharp deploys the ATDTCS he develops in the previous chapter. Its deployment for this purpose, though, does not actually depend on the shift from TCS to ATDTCS; his theory of inconsistent concepts could just as well be given in a TCS formulation (where it would amount to a particular style of assessment-sensitive theory). However, Scharp has already argued that truth is unsuitable for serious theorizing, and so is obliged to replace TCS with ATDTCS.

Finally, Chapter 10 sums up, considering life after 'the aletheic revolution' (that is, after truth is replaced with the team of ascending truth and descending truth), and responding to some potential objections.


Replacing Truth is rich and deeply rewarding, and I won't be able to do it full justice here; instead, I will point to some of the reasons I'm excited about it.

I suspect that a theory of inconsistent concepts (or something in the area, anyhow) is crucial for understanding a variety of philosophical (and other) puzzles. Scharp's careful and persuasive work on inconsistent concepts (particularly in Chapters 2 and 9) repays study and is likely to be widely applicable. This discussion will be of interest to philosophers of language and concepts quite generally, whether or not they are concerned with truth or paradox. Scharp's approach to inconsistent concepts does not itself require (although it is required by) the book's approach to truth.

Scharp's clear attention to methodological issues is also very welcome. In a number of standard discussions (particularly logical discussions) of truth and paradoxes, it can sometimes be unclear whether the novel formal systems presented are intended as recommendations for revisions in our practice with the truth predicate (Scharp's 'prescriptive theory' serves this purpose), or as recommendations for revisions in our understanding of our current practice (Scharp's 'descriptive theory' serves this purpose). Scharp never falls into this unclarity, and develops clear, interesting, and distinct recommendations of both sorts. This advances two separate (but overlapping) debates, both by contributing to them and by making plainer just how distinct they are.

This is even before we get to the book's main thrust: the arguments for replacing truth, and the proposed replacements. These too are rich and rewarding, and I will engage briefly with a few aspects of them below. But really, if this kind of thing is at all your bag, read the book; there's a lot in it worth your time. I'm just going to be able to sketch a few fragments here.

The argument for replacement

Scharp's main argument (the 'obvious argument') that truth is an inconsistent concept is based on the liar paradox in a familiar way: since there is a valid argument to contradiction from truth's constitutive principles, truth must be an inconsistent concept. In order for the obvious argument to work, it is vital that proposed resolutions of the liar paradox don't succeed in resolving it. Truth must be genuinely inconsistent for Scharp's approach to work. Since almost nobody thinks that more than one proposed resolution is viable (and plenty of people doubt it's even that many!), each of Scharp's conclusions here (this approach doesn't work, that approach doesn't work, etc.) will be congenial to most readers.

Nonetheless, I want to focus on one aspect of the overall argument, and suggest that something is amiss. The trouble arises in Scharp's consideration of approaches to truth based on nonclassical logics. As he points out (p. 81), no nontrivial logical system (with a rich enough theory of syntax) can accept all of 1) modus ponens and conditional proof (for the same conditional connective), 2) 'the standard structural rules for derivability' (in particular transitivity and contraction), and 3) capture and release.

Scharp also argues here that modus ponens and conditional proof are constitutive principles of the conditional, and that transitivity and contraction are constitutive of 'the derivability operator' (p. 81). He had earlier argued that the capture and release are constitutive of truth. Thus, the constitutive principles of all these things taken together yield triviality, so they cannot all be correct. Assuming the conclusions of Scharp's component arguments, either the conditional, or validity, or truth must have some incorrect constitutive principles, and so be an inconsistent concept. But why is he so sure it's truth?

The answer seems to have something to do with achieving the appropriate level of generality, in particular making sure not to overgeneralize. Scharp offers:

the case for adopting a non-classical logic . . . . should not be made by trying to accommodate the constitutive principles of some other concept that is classically inconsistent. I think this point can be made against any attempt to alter our logic in the face of paradoxes. Sure, we could do so, but this move is a "language-wide" change, which means that arguments having nothing to do with the concept in question (truth in our case) that were previously considered valid, will turn out to be invalid. (p. 81)

For example, to claim that modus ponens is the erroneous constitutive principle would affect our theories of validity across the board, even when no paradoxes are involved.

I fully endorse the desire not to overgeneralize, to keep our approaches to paradox from ramifying too broadly and 'fixing' what wasn't broken. I worry, though, that Scharp's truth-focused approach has the opposite problem: it undergeneralizes, missing common features between paradoxes that do and paradoxes that don't involve truth.

Let's put on our inspector hats and break out the magnifying glasses. There's a wave of paradoxes sweeping the city, and we need to find the culprit before they strike again. There are liar paradoxes and curry paradoxes, restricted-quantification curries (Beall et al., 2006) and validity curries (Shapiro, 2011; Beall and Murzi, 2013), russells and Hinnion-Liberts (Hinnion and Libert, 2003; Restall, 2013), all with a common modus operandi.[1]

To narrow down our list of suspects, it makes sense to ask: Who was at every one of the crime scenes? Using this method, logical vocabulary all comes out in the clear. It's not negation; he was out of town when the curries happened. It's not the conditional; she was nowhere near the liars (assuming, anyway, that negation isn't just the conditional with a false moustache on). But truth comes out in the clear too: it's got a solid alibi for the russells, the Hinnion-Liberts, and the validity curries (as well as knowers and Montagues). In fact, there are only two characters that turn up at all of the crime scenes: contraction and transitivity, both things Scharp claims are constitutive for validity. We should be very sure indeed that validity isn't our culprit before we spend too much time harassing truth.

Since contraction and transitivity both apply to our entire language, the worry of overgeneralization naturally returns; without one of these, won't our reasoning be crippled across the board, even when paradoxes don't threaten at all? But at least in the case of transitivity, this is demonstrably not so: there are nontransitive logics that validate all classically-valid arguments together with a fully naive theory of truth, while remaining nontrivial (see, e.g., Ripley, 2013). Given Scharp's other views, then, I reckon he should take seriously the idea that it is validity, rather than truth, that is an inconsistent concept -- indeed the inconsistent concept at the core of the paradoxes. (Scharp briefly considers the idea that validity is inconsistent (p. 218), but for different reasons, and without pursuing it.)

The proffered replacements

Having argued that truth should be replaced, Scharp proposes to replace it with a pair of concepts: ascending truth and descending truth. The names are perhaps misleading; neither of these concepts is a kind of truth at all -- that's the whole point! That is, despite the names, being ascending true and being descending true are not  ways of being true; they are other statuses entirely. (Scharp sometimes speaks of 'ascending and descending truth', but if we are being careful this should strike us the same as 'The League of and The United Nations'.)

Scharp gives an axiomatisation, which he calls ADT, of ascending and descending truth. (ADT is not meant to be the full story about ascending and descending truth, but rather an important sub-story (p. 153).) According to ADT, the claim that φ is descending true, which I'll write D〈φ〉, is at least as strong as φ itself, but possibly stronger. The claim that φ is ascending true, which I'll write A〈φ〉, is at least as weak as φ itself, but possibly weaker. That is, D〈φ → φ and φ → A〈φ〉 are theorems of ADT, but their converses are not. In addition, ascending and descending truth are duals; a sentence is descending true iff its negation is not ascending true, and ascending true iff its negation is not descending true. (This is only a small part of ADT; I won't present the axiomatisation in full here, but will instead focus just on some of its more striking features.)

It is possible to see in this a 'splitting' of the familiar T-schema, T〈φ〉↔ φ. Descending truth takes over the left-to-right direction of this equivalence, and ascending truth takes over the right-to-left direction. (Ascending truth 'captures' but does not 'release'; descending truth 'releases' but does not 'capture'.) It can be tempting to think (and it is sometimes true) that other familiar alethic principles will work like this as well, but this is not always so; some care is required. For example, we usually expect a truth predicate to validate the followingconjunction schema: (T φ ∧ T〈ψ〉) ↔ T〈φ ∧ ψ〉. The directions of this schema, though, are not split between ascending and descending truth; neither of them validates the left-to-right direction of the conjunction schema, while both validate the right-to-left direction instead. (The left-to-right direction is secured on a mixed reading: (D〈φ〉∧ D〈ψ) → A〈φ ∧ ψ〉is a theorem (p. 171).)

As the example of the conjunction schema shows, neither ascending nor descending truth is closed under multi-premise validity (since φ, ψ ⊢ φ ∧ ψ); nor is either of them closed under single-premise validity. Neither is even closed under replacement of logical equivalents (p. 173). That is, there are sentences φ and ψ such that φ ↔ ψ is a theorem, and D〈φ〉is a theorem, but D〈ψ〉is not. (In fact, there are cases like this where ¬D〈ψ〉is a theorem. For example, let φ be an axiom of ADT, and let ψ be the 'descending liar' discussed below.) This can take some getting used to.

A sentence φ is 'safe' iff A〈φ〉→ D〈φ〉; for safe sentences, ascending truth and descending truth are equivalent (since D〈φ〉→ A〈φ〉 is a theorem of ADT for every φ), and since φ is always sandwiched between D〈φ〉and A〈φ〉, it too is equivalent to these when it is safe. For safe sentences, then, we can forget about the distinction between ascending and descending truth, and treat them (more or less) as we would treat truth, were it present. (For example, where φ ∧ ψ is safe, descending truth will satisfy the full conjunction schema above; where both φ and ψ are safe, ascending truth will.) But for unsafe sentences φ, there are three separate claims to keep track of: D〈φ〉, A〈φ〉, and φ itself.

Scharp proves that ADT is consistent (relative to ZFC) model-theoretically, by developing structures he calls 'xeno models'. These are a bit kludgey: they combine neighborhood models for modal logic with additional formula-indexed accessibility relations with revision sequences on top. But despite the kitchen-sink nature of Scharp's consistency proof, it is reasonably straightforward to get a feel for how ADT stays consistent: it is a combination of a classical glut theory and a classical gap theory (see Field, 2008 for discussion).

To see what I mean, consider the 'descending liar': a sentence δ that is ¬D〈δ〉. If δ is descending true, then it is not descending true (since D〈φ〉→ φ for any φ, and since δ says that it is not descending true); so it is not descending true. Now we have proved δ itself. But this is where it stops; there is no way to get to any trouble from here, since there is no way to conclude from δ itself that δ is descending true.

Taking stock, δ is ascending true but not descending true; it is unsafe. Like all unsafe sentences, its negation is also unsafe. (If ¬φ is safe, then ¬φ is either descending true or it is not ascending true. If ¬φ is descending true, then φ cannot be ascending true, since A and D are dual, and so φ is safe. If ¬φ is not ascending true, then φ is descending true, since A and D are dual, and so φ is safe.) That is, every unsafe sentence is such that both it and its negation are ascending true, and neither it nor its negation is descending true. ADT, while fully classical, is a theory of ascending gluts and descending gaps; the unsafe sentences fall into these categories.

Like all classical glut and classical gap theories, then, it has some sticky points around the paradoxes. It is not like δ and its negation have the same status in ADT; after all, δ is a theorem of ADT (and its negation, therefore, cannot be added to ADT on pain of contradiction). But this difference in status cannot be discussed in ADT itself; both δ and its negation are ascending true, neither is descending true, and those are the only relevant statuses that can be talked about. What, then, is the difference between them? It seems clear: according to ADT, δ is true, but its negation isn't. But ADT has been designed not to be able to express this.

Note, in this connection, that Scharp's proposed ATDTCS cannot get at this distinction either: δ and its negation (or their natural language equivalents) have precisely the same ascending and descending truth conditions as each other. (They are both always ascending true, and never descending true.) Yet they must differ in meaning, since one is true, and the other is not. It doesn't require 'true' to express the point. The following schema should be very natural for a consistentist like Scharp: 'if φ and ¬ψ, then 〈φ〉 and 〈ψ〉 differ in meaning'. But this principle is incompatible with ATDTCS, given ADT.

We should also expect ADT, as a classical gap/glut theory, to face difficulties about truth's role as a device of endorsement; and this expectation is born out. Scharp makes a number of claims in Replacing Truth. Among them is the claim that δ is not descending true (p. 173); that is, among them is δ itself. Suppose I want to endorse the contents of Scharp's book without repeating the entire thing myself. How can I do it, after the aletheic revolution? I cannot say 'Everything in this book is descending true'; this is to disagree with the contents of the book, due to the unsafe sentences asserted in it (together with the claims that they are unsafe). But descending truth is Scharp's proposed replacement for truth in its role as a device of endorsement (p. 174).

Ascending truth won't work as a device of endorsement either -- asserting that something is ascending true is too weak to count as endorsing it -- and Scharp does not offer it as one. He does propose ascending truth for use in rejection, but duality ensures it has the same problem in rejections as descending truth does in endorsements.

In places, Scharp acknowledges these problems but minimizes them ('there is no such thing as a consistent genuine device of endorsement. Descending truth is as close as one can [consistently] get' (p. 281)). Elsewhere, he leaves them offstage entirely ('ascending and descending truth, together, can perform truth's expressive role. That is, they can serve as devices of endorsement and rejection' (p. 156, where unsafe sentences are very much dialectically relevant)).

It is important, though, to keep these limitations in mind, particularly because they are not optional. It is not as though, had Scharp only been more clever, he could have designed consistent replacements that meet his other desiderata and still fully serve truth's expressive role; no such replacements are possible. There is just no way, the way Scharp proceeds, to remove the inconsistency from truth without at the same time removing some of its usefulness. Replacing truth, like Replacing Truth, is and must be fraught with compromise.

Despite this, I find the book very productive to engage with; its vision, clarity of purpose, and creativity all come in large measures. Although I'm pretty sure Replacing Truth's approach to the paradoxes is barking up the wrong tree, I'm also confident I'll be returning to the book for some time; Scharp's voice is indispensable in this conversation.


Beall, J., Brady, R. T., Hazen, A. P., Priest, G., and Restall, G. (2006). Relevant restricted quantification. Journal of Philosophical Logic, 35(6): 587-598.

Beall, J. and Murzi, J. (2013). Two flavors of Curry's paradox. Journal of Philosophy, 110(3):143-165.

Field, H. (2008). Saving Truth from Paradox. Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Hinnion, R. and Libert, T. (2003). Positive abstraction and extensionality. Journal of Symbolic Logic, 68(3): 828-836.

Predelli, S. (2005). Contexts: Meaning, Truth, and the Use of Language. Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Priest, G. (2002). Beyond the Limits of Thought. Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Restall, G. (2013). Assertion, denial, and non-classical theories. In Tanaka, K., Berto, F., Mares, E., and Paoli, F., editors, Paraconsistency: Logic and Applications, pp. 81-100. Springer, Dordrecht.

Ripley, D. (2013). Paradoxes and failures of cut. Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 91(1): 139-164.

Shapiro, L. (2011). Deflating logical consequence. Philosophical Quarterly, 61(243): 320-342.

This 'common' is of course contentious.  In particular, Graham Priest's 'inclosure schema' (Priest, 2002) draws a bright line between liars and their relatives on one side and curries and their relatives on the other.  I would make the same objection, then, to the inclosure schema.

[1] This 'common' is of course contentious.  In particular, Graham Priest's 'inclosure schema' (Priest, 2002) draws a bright line between liars and their relatives on one side and curries and their relatives on the other.  I would make the same objection, then, to the inclosure schema.