Representation and Productive Ambiguity in Mathematics and the Sciences

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Emily R. Grosholz, Representation and Productive Ambiguity in Mathematics and the Sciences, Oxford University Press, 2007, 313pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199299737.

Reviewed by Doug Jesseph, North Carolina State University


This is an ambitious book that intends to "do full justice to the special rigor of mathematical and scientific reasoning," and to make the case that such reasoning "is more inclusive and multifarious than philosophers of mathematics have admitted during the past century" (p. xi). The range of topics is remarkably broad. It includes Galileo's account of projectile motion, the construction of the antibody mimic in biochemistry, the groundbreaking genetic work of McClintock and Fedoroff on gene transmutation, the application of group theory to quantum chemistry, Descartes' Géométrie, Newton's Principia, Leibniz's account of transcendental curves, algebraic topology, and topological approaches to logic. The emphasis throughout is on the ways in which scientists and mathematicians represent the objects of their study, and the role of "productive ambiguities" in the discovery of new results. An ambiguity is productive when it brings together two very different styles of representation and allows them to be put in a rational relation that can illuminate new ways of understanding the objects of inquiry. Much of the book is devoted to the investigation of cases intended to show that scientific and mathematical results result from such ambiguities.

There is a great deal to recommend this effort. The wide range of topics and the detail in which they are discussed offer some significant insights into the philosophy of science and mathematics. Moreover, Grosholz makes a generally persuasive case that scientific progress is often the result of a synthesis from several traditions that combines very different ways of representing the same subject matter. The case studies are clearly presented and the level of argument is for the most point quite high. Where the book fails to convince is in the articulation of a general philosophy of science and mathematics.

Grosholz advocates a "pragmatist" philosophy of science and mathematics which proceeds by "taking into account the pragmatic as well as the syntactic and semantic features of representation in mathematics," because a focus "on the pragmatic dimension of mathematical language allows us to see the philosophical interest of useful ambiguity in mathematics, as well as the limits of formalization" (p. 23). The book therefore fits into the recent trend in the philosophy of mathematics which pays attention to the styles of reasoning employed by actual mathematicians in their day to day work. William Byers' How Mathematicians Think and Marcus Giaquinto's Visual Thinking in Mathematics are two recent contributions to this literature, which aims to correct the misimpression that mathematicians obtain their results by means of a quasi-mechanical deduction of theorems from axioms and definitions.

The distinction between syntactic, semantic, and pragmatic considerations is familiar from linguistics, but there is reason to wonder if the introduction of pragmatic considerations can support the level of generality Grosholz desires for her treatment of the sciences. The pristine lofty heights of syntax offer a generalized account of a language in abstraction from considerations of truth, meaning or use; the lush forests of semantics yield detailed treatments of such notions as meaning and interpretation abstracted from the linguistic practices of a speech community; and the murky swamp of pragmatics attempts to explain how syntax and semantics jibe with speakers' typical communicative practices. Thus, syntactic analysis can tell us that the expression "All that glitters is not gold" is a grammatically correct English sentence, while the ordinary semantics of English reveals that it is equivalent in meaning to "Nothing gold glitters." Pragmatics then attempts to explain why and how speakers of English almost invariably use this sentence to convey the notion that some glittering things are not really gold. Inevitably, recourse to pragmatics requires reference to very "localized" considerations of speakers' beliefs, backgrounds, intentions, conventions, etc. A salient result of this attention to such matters of context and presupposition is that pragmatic considerations rarely yield results with a high degree of generality. Or, as a linguistics professor of mine put it years ago, pragmatics is what you're left with when you don't really have a linguistic theory. This sort of limitation is of concern in the present case because it is difficult to see a common theoretical structure that can link cases in algebraic topology, biochemistry, molecular biology, and Newtonian mechanics. There may be some interesting analogies among the many different cases Grosholz studies, but I found it difficult to see them all as instances of the very same kind of reasoning or inference.

Grosholz sees pragmatism as refuting positivistic philosophies of science that emphasize purely syntactic analysis of scientific theories. Thus, her first chapter "Galileo contra Carnap" is given over to a study of Galileo's account of projectile motion. Not surprisingly, Galileo's actual reasoning falls well short of Carnap's ideal of a science developed in a language that is "pure" (in the sense that it is free from extraneous conceptual elements) and "formally accurate" (in the sense that its definitions are unambiguous). As Grosholz shows in some detail, Galileo's work "involves icons and natural language as well as symbols; and many of the modes of representation that it employs refer ambiguously" (p. 19), and it therefore fails to fit into the Carnapian approach. This offers significant (though hardly novel) evidence that the positivists' "purely syntactic" model of scientific theories is inadequate as an account of Galileo's practice. The semantic conception of scientific theories comes in for similar criticism, namely that attention to such model-theoretic concepts as isomorphism fail to capture the important pragmatic aspects of scientific and mathematical practice.

A fundamental thesis in this book is that working scientists and mathematicians combine different "modes of representation" in their work, exploiting the ambiguity that arises when features of one kind of representation are transferred to another. A notable example is Leibniz's "principle of continuity" which allows limit cases to be assimilated into a general principle: rest is taken to be the limiting case of motion, the straight line is the limiting case of a circle with an ever-increasing radius, etc. In Leibniz's formulation, the principle holds that "one can treat an external extremum as if it were internal, so that the last case or instance, even if it is of a nature completely different, is subsumed under the general law governing the others" (quoted on p. 205). On Grosholz's interpretation of Leibniz, his approach to the infinitesimal calculus exploits the ambiguity that arises from taking reasoning about finite increments and then applying it to the infinitesimal case. It goes almost without saying that neither Carnapian positivist philosophy of science, nor a semantic approach to mathematical theories, nor the "logicism" associated with Bertrand Russell's reconstruction of Leibniz can do full justice to the reasoning we find in his studies on the calculus.

As fruitful as Grosholz's insights into the history and philosophy of science are, I remain unsure whether her approach is fully satisfactory. There are plenty of cases where mathematicians have gone astray when using intuitively plausible but ultimately misleading lines of reasoning that trade on ambiguity, vagueness, or other problematic characteristics. Leonhard Euler's use of divergent series is a compelling example: he had no compunction about assigning a sum to a divergent series depending on the needs of the problem he happened to be addressing, with the consequence that the same series could be assigned very different sums. Eventually, the accumulation of glaring inconsistencies in analysis led to Niels Abel's famous denunciation of divergent series as the "work of the Devil" that must be banned from all demonstrations. Likewise, many famous mathematical problems have had apparent solutions that were later shown to be incomplete or otherwise unsatisfactory, notwithstanding the intuitively plausible arguments offered in their support.[1]

In point of fact, even the dreaded positivists famously distinguished between the context of discovery and the context of justification; this frankly seems to permit as much "pragmatism" as one might wish in the study of the context of discovery, while requiring that in the context of justification scientific and mathematical theories must be developed rigorously in a language that satisfies Carnap's requirements of linguistic "purity" and "formal adequacy." If the distinction is accepted, the way seems open to do full justice to the important facts Grosholz has identified while still requiring that, in the context of justification, a properly developed theory must satisfy requirements of rigor more stringent than those in play in the context of discovery.

Grosholz's own pragmatist philosophy of mathematics is also something of a mystery. She rejects any kind of formalism or structuralism, insisting that the objects of mathematical investigation "are not to be confused with notation or diagrams; notations and diagrams never exhaust or replace the mathematical items they are designed to represent" (p. xiii). Mathematical platonism is likewise dismissed, as "an account that says that everything that is true about the natural numbers is always already true, in some big theory in the sky" (p. 267). Other philosophers have worried about how a concrete physical system of notation can successfully refer to abstract objects like sets or numbers, and the causal isolation of such abstracta has been taken to pose a serious epistemological problem of explaining how we can know anything about such objects. For her part, Grosholz seems to take it as unproblematic that our notation refers to such things and that we can know a great deal about them. In her view, mathematical objects are "intelligible things," and "our awareness of intelligible things proceeds by representations, even though it cannot be identified with any one such representation or even a 'complete set' of them, as there are no such complete sets" (p. 47). Although disavowing mathematical platonism, she is nevertheless happy to posit an intelligible realm of objects that can be partially represented by our notation and diagrams, but which ultimately remains largely intractable and ineffable. Attempts to reduce this autonomous intelligible realm to something more fundamental (such as set theory, or logic, or category theory) are ruled out as inappropriate because they fail to recognize the nature of such intelligibles. In the case of geometry, Grosholz writes that: "[s]et theory in connection with modern logic has persuaded us to accept as an equation what is only an analogy, and to suppose that the things of geometry may unproblematically and unreflectively be decomposed into (sets of) points" (p. 37). This account seems to depend to a significant degree on a rather idiosyncratic conception of logic as "the study of the rules of thought; it thus wishes to represent how we think independent of what we happen to be thinking about" (p. 283). I confess that every practicing logician I know finds this characterization of logic very puzzling -- how people actually think, and what sorts of inferences they are prepared to accept in practice are often very far removed from the things studied in proof theory, model theory, or recursion theory.

These worries about the adequacy of Grosholz's positive philosophy of science and mathematics should not, however, detract from her achievement. She has given us a very readable and well-argued series of case studies in the history and philosophy of the sciences. Anyone with an interest in the history of mathematics, the history of science, or the general philosophy of science is bound to find a wealth of interesting material here.

[1] Two examples stand out here: the long history of attempted proofs of the Euler polyhedral formula V+F-E = 2, and failed solutions to Sylvester's problem (show that it is impossible to arrange any finite number of points so that a right line through any two of them passes through a third, unless they all lie in the same right line).