Representation, Evidence, and Justification: Themes from Suppes

Placeholder book cover

Michael Frauchiger and Wilhelm K. Essler (eds.), Representation, Evidence, and Justification: Themes from Suppes, Ontos, 2008, 179pp., $108.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793824.

Reviewed by Kenny Easwaran, University of Southern California/Australian National University


This book is the first in a planned series, the Lauener Library of Analytical Philosophy. Each volume will consist primarily of versions of the papers presented at a symposium in Bern, Switzerland, honoring the winner of the biennial Lauener Prize for an Outstanding Oeuvre in Analytical Philosophy. This book honors Patrick Suppes, the recipient in 2004. (Other winners of the prize are Dagfinn Føllesdal in 2006, and Ruth Barcan Marcus in 2008.) It contains some interesting overall discussion of Suppes' work and also some very interesting papers by a diversity of philosophers, but the two aspects occasionally seem to get in each other's way. Hopefully the future volumes in the series can avoid this tension, and also have improved copy-editing (about which more later).

The volume opens with brief prefatory remarks by Wilhelm Essler and Michael Frauchiger, the series' editors. Essler discusses Henri Lauener and the establishment of the prize, while Frauchiger introduces the series and this particular volume. Reflecting the prize's scope, both pieces contain an interesting paragraph or two giving their author's perspectives on what exactly constitutes analytic (or "accurate") philosophy. As Frauchiger puts it,

Analytical philosophers have been making a serious effort to benefit, philosophically, from the manifold developments within mathematical logics and semantics, so as to establish standards of truly intersubjective communicability, soundness, and reliability … . There are undoubtedly some significant philosophers in the 20th century, such as Husserl and Cassirer, who are not usually classed to belong to the analytical tradition, but whose works clearly have the above-mentioned characteristics of analytical, or rather accurate, philosophizing. (p. 6)

The need for such a characterization, together with the details, seems to suggest some of the concerns of the Swiss philosophical community. These introductory remarks are followed by a "Laudatio" by Suppes' colleague at Stanford, Dagfinn Føllesdal, which gives a biographical sketch of Suppes and a discussion of six major areas in which Suppes has worked: methodology, probability, and measurement; psychology; physics; language and logic; computers and education; and mind and brain.

The volume closes with an interview between Frauchiger and Suppes that contains very interesting discussion of all these issues, as well as Suppes' interpretation of some parts of his intellectual development. He also makes some interesting remarks about how he sees the role of philosophy in public life in the United States. In addition to pointing out that philosophy graduates have been successful and in demand in the corporate world, he says,

We do not now, are not going to have in the future, philosophers drawing evangelical TV crowds. But we can and do have a serious impact on the students who later become decision makers, political leaders, and policy makers in our society. The impact is not as much as we would like, but it is not negligible… . From a broad perspective, the role of philosophy in these general courses satisfying distribution requirements is the most important way in which the vast majority of American university students have any exposure to philosophy. (p. 178)

The claims about how influential philosophy is, and what form that influence takes, are surely controversial, but we should recall that Suppes has far more experience in both the worlds of education and corporations than most philosophers, through his Computer Curriculum Corporation, as well as his other research on learning. It would have been interesting to have more about this side of Suppes' career in this book, but given the relatively small number of philosophers who have done serious research on educational methods, it is perhaps understandable that this has been left out.

Between the introductory remarks, and the closing interview, the rest of the book consists of six unrelated papers, by Suppes, Føllesdal, Essler, Nancy Cartwright, Stephan Hartmann, and Steven French, and brief responses by Suppes to the papers of the other five. Frauchiger says in his preface, "The book's purpose is to give the reader ample scope for finding out about the present development of a wide range of philosophical and methodological themes on which Suppes has set out seminal ideas." (p. 5) However, the result is that there is very little thematic coherence between the different papers. In a few cases, the connection to the work of Suppes is not very pronounced, though his comments sometimes help bring out the points of intersection.

Suppes' paper, "A Revised Agenda for Philosophy of Mind (and Brain)", sets forth a range of thoughts on how the philosophy of mind should be reorganized in a more naturalistic mode, which he argues is already in line with the thoughts of Aristotle, Aquinas, and Hume. While I am not competent enough in the philosophy of mind to evaluate his general arguments, he has interesting remarks on how we manage to automatically evaluate the truth-value even of atomic sentences we have never heard before, like "Paris is the capital of Poland" and "Rome is north of London". These remarks are accompanied by a discussion of the way in which these could be processed by purely associative methods, rather than computational ones, as well as a presentation of data on the brain-waves of people processing such sentences.

I don't have space for a full discussion of all the papers, so I will just briefly mention those of Føllesdal, Essler, and French, before discussing Cartwright's and Hartmann's in more depth. Føllesdal's "The Emergence of Justification in Ethics" concerns the method of reflective equilibrium, and the way in which this was anticipated as a justificatory device by Husserl. Essler's "The World and the Worlds" I found somewhat puzzling, but the idea seems to be that the existence of a Tarskian hierarchy of languages and metalanguages leads to a sort of hierarchy of worlds, rather than a single objective world. French's paper (like the two I will discuss in more detail) deals with the philosophy of science. He considers the prospects for notions of reference and representation if structural realism is the correct understanding of scientific theories. In the end, he suggests that the notion of partial isomorphism (discussed at length by French and various co-authors elsewhere), and other set-theoretic understandings of the structural theories, can save a kind of reference, even if there are no objects in our traditional understanding of them.

The paper that seemed to me to most directly engage the work of Suppes was Cartwright's "In Praise of the Representation Theorem". This paper begins with Michael Friedman's discussion of a notion of the synthetic a priori that we get from science. But whereas Friedman finds this notion by taking dynamical principles like Newton's laws of motion to be constitutive principles defining the notions of force, acceleration, and inertial reference frame, Cartwright argues that the relevant a priori principles are instead representation theorems for the relevant notion of measurement. She gives, as an example, a system of principles for a set of laws relating variables that take the form of linear relations, together with a designated set of laws that count as causal. Cartwright then states a representation theorem for this system of principles (which she proves elsewhere), showing that the causal laws in such a system will be exactly the laws that are unchanged under interventions. This means that an operational characterization of an intervention can then let us pick out the causal laws as those that remain invariant. Her main point is the important work that the theorem does here -- in the absence of such a theorem, the operationalized notion of intervention would seem like an ad hoc stipulation of an account of causal laws. But the conditions for the theorem would not be satisfied by just any operational characterization, so the fact that they are satisfied shows that our operationalization is not ad hoc. Since the principles from which the theorem is proved are just the conceptual characterizations of the relation between interventions and causal laws, the theorem can rightly be seen as a part of the a priori grounding for science, and so does important work. Thus, Cartwright suggests that it is in the principles from which representation theorems are proved that science finds its synthetic a priori, and not in the principles that Friedman focuses on.

Of course, this sort of representation theorem is familiar from the multi-volume Foundations of Measurement that Suppes co-authored over several decades with Luce, Krantz, and Tversky, as well as his more recent work, so this discussion is quite appropriate. In his comments Suppes mainly adds that the disagreement between Cartwright and Friedman can also be characterized as one over whether the constitutive principles are kinematic or dynamic, and that while he generally agrees with Cartwright, he can't fully dismiss the historical evidence that Friedman raises, especially in the history of electromagnetism.

Given my own interests in Bayesianism, Hartmann's "Modeling in Philosophy of Science" is the paper I found most interesting. He follows a long tradition of contemporary philosophers of science (including Suppes -- this is apparently the primary connection of this article to his work) that we can more often understand scientists as working with models, rather than theories, of the world. That is, they work with a representation of some sort of limited system rather than with a collection of universal statements. Hartmann suggests that this sort of scientific methodology may also be a better methodology for philosophy of science -- rather than constructing theories about scientific reasoning, philosophers may often benefit from more restricted models of certain procedures.

The application Hartmann makes of this proposal is to consider one prominent theory of science, which he calls "Textbook Bayesianism", and contrast it with a more model-based approach he calls "Naturalized Bayesianism". Textbook Bayesianism analyzes scientific practice by considering the confirmation relations that hold between a hypothesis H and various pieces of evidence Ei, as measured by some probabilistic function of these variables. Hartmann's Naturalized Bayesianism, by contrast, views a scientific theory not as a single hypothesis H, but rather as a class of models Mi, which are nodes in a Bayesian network, that also has nodes corresponding to the pieces of evidence Ei. He then uses this framework to give purported analyses of two problems for standard Bayesianism -- the fact that variety of evidence is not always a benefit, and the fact that a sort of Kuhnian normal science appears to be stable. His analysis of a variety of evidence seems sound (basically, he considers a situation with a variety of available potentially unreliable instruments for checking parts of a theory -- if they are likely to be unreliable, then several positive results on a single instrument becomes evidence for the reliability of the instrument, which can then support the theory, while if they are likely to be reliable, then using multiple instruments can safely test multiple aspects of the theory) but the analysis of normal science seems much more abstract and speculative. Additionally (as I mention again below), some typos in the formulas made it hard for me to be sure that I was properly following the argument.

Suppes, in his reply, is generally sympathetic to the broad moves towards a model-based methodology, and more naturalistic versions of Bayesianism. However, he has interesting criticisms of the Bayesian project in general, and of the idea of using Bayesian networks in particular. The basic idea is that the picture of Bayesianism as used by philosophers (including Hartmann and the authors he cites) tends to almost entirely ignore the notion of Bayesianism that is current in statistics. This notion involves a critique of the traditional methodology for statistical inference, for ignoring issues about prior information, and also for making the importance of likelihoods and other concepts much more opaque.

While I agree with Suppes that these issues of statistical methodology are too often ignored by philosophers, I think Suppes may be conflating the goals of Bayesian confirmation theory (which is Hartmann's interest) and Bayesian statistical inference. The goal of confirmation theory is to find some general theory (Hartmann might prefer using models) of the notion of evidential support, and to use this to illuminate a variety of aspects of scientific practice. The goal of statistical inference (at least much of the time) is a much more specific one of finding out whether or not a specific conclusion can be drawn from the data. This is clearly connected to the notion of support, but since the data can support many theories without being univocal enough to justify drawing a single conclusion, I think it's useful to keep the two notions distinct. But I would be very interested in seeing Suppes develop his argument at greater length, especially to see if he has good reason to collapse this distinction.

Thus, this volume contains interesting contributions to the projects of several prominent philosophers, each here viewed through the lens of some aspect of the work of Patrick Suppes. Unfortunately, apart from Cartwright's paper, the connections to the work of Suppes are often somewhat tenuous, so the volume feels more like an issue of a journal than a thematically-connected collection. Those who are not as familiar with Suppes' work will take particular interest in Frauchiger's interview with Suppes, which gives an outline of many themes throughout Suppes' work and life, and also Suppes' own contribution, which gives a more in-depth look at his current projects in the philosophy of mind.

Unfortunately, the quality of copy editing could be improved. There are some passages in the pieces by the editors of the volume in which the English is unidiomatic and hard to follow. This is no fault of the authors, but the publisher could surely have found a native English speaker to give them some feedback. There are a few more serious issues in the mathematical typesetting. It took a bit of work to realize that the set-membership symbol was rendered in Essler's paper as the Roman letter "e", while in Cartwright's paper as the Greek letter "ε", rather than the more traditional "∈". And more confusingly, at several points in Hartmann's paper, the phrase "P(M1, Mi, … , Mn | E1, Ei, … , En) is greater than P(M1, Mi, … , Mn | E1, Ei, … , En-1)" is rendered as "P(M1, Mi, … , Mn | E1, Ei, … , En) is greater than P(M1, Mi, … , Mn| E1, Ei, … , En)", which makes no sense. I suspect that some of Hartmann's other formulas have been rendered incorrectly, but it was hard to be completely sure which.