Representation of Language: Philosophical Issues in a Chomskyan Linguistics

Rep Of Language

Georges Rey, Representation of language: Philosophical issues in a Chomskyan linguistics, Oxford University Press, 2020, 480pp., $94.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198855637.

Reviewed by John Collins, University of East Anglia


Georges Rey’s splendid volume serves as an expert survey of Chomsky’s theoretical thinking as well as offering critical engagement where he deems him to have gone wrong philosophically, if not empirically. The volume teems with insight and good sense, and is a uniformly entertaining read to boot. It will serve equally well for philosophers interested in linguistics and for linguists interested in the philosophical foundations of Chomsky’s position.

The volume is divided into three parts. The first two deal with ‘core’ issues in linguistics and philosophy respectively. While the chapters included here are broadly exegetical and supportive of Chomsky, Rey offers distinctive takes on many issues, and highlights numerous aspects of Chomsky’s thought that are often neglected or misconstrued. I shall focus on just two: the methodological relevance of negative phenomena and innateness. The third part is concerned with intentionality; here Rey departs from Chomsky’s various animadversions against the role of intentionality in serious theorising. Rey seeks to defuse these objections, but in ways that are consistent with the previously elaborated ‘core’ claims of Chomsky’s approach. Here I shall voice some reservations.

The first feature of Rey’s discussion I wish to highlight concerns methodology. Rey coordinates his discussion via what Chomsky calls the ‘Galilean style’ (a term originally coined by Husserl, but widely used). In this light, a theory is not a catalogue of phenomena, but a specification of an abstract system that enters into the explanation of observed phenomena, which themselves are too variegated and irregular to submit to any generalisation. Fundamentally, the post-Galilean conception situates the actual in the space of the possible (what invariances allow for) and so explains not so much what is, which is often too messy to allow for proper explanation, but why things are as they are as opposed to some other conceivable way. Rey beautifully captures how this style plays out in Chomsky’s thinking in the form of what Rey calls ‘WhyNots’, which alone serve to justify much of Chomsky’s programme (1). A ‘WhyNot’ is a pair of constructions, the first member of which speaker-hearers find acceptable, the second not, even though it is clear what the unacceptable case should mean. The question is thus: why aren’t the second cases OK? For example, consider the cases below (21):

(1) a Stories about Caesar terrified Mary

     b Who did stories about Caesar terrify?

     c *Who did stories about terrify Mary?

(1c) is unacceptable, but why should it be? It simply amounts to questioning the position of Caesar in (1a) just as the acceptable (1b) questions the position of Mary. Indeed, the ‘intended meaning’ is easily recoverable and can be readily specified:

(2) Which person is such that stories about him/her terrified Mary?

Such cases, and innumerable other ones that fill up any syntax textbook, do not offer any direct insight into a grammar, but are simply data. Crucially, however, and this is Rey’s core point, the phenomena appear to show that speaker-hearers are sensitive to syntactic structure, whose organisation explains why some constructions are deemed unacceptable. That speakers converge so readily in rejecting novel cases, even though they express ‘fine thoughts’ (witness (2)), is prima facie evidence for Rey that the source of the convergence is innate, much as similar convergence is in the realm of visual cognition, say.

Rey is quick to note that other cases of unacceptability might not be due to grammar, but other factors (35–8). The general point is, though, that insofar as phenomena can’t be explained by these other factors, their explanation appears to involve speaker-hearers’ sensitivity to sui generis grammatical factors. This division gives one a competence/performance distinction.

In this light, negative phenomena are highly significant for the justification of the programme, just as they should be from a Galilean perspective, for they present ways language could be, but isn’t, and so accounting for the phenomena includes explanation of why language is the way it is, as opposed to some other way. If one rested content with an explanation of just positive phenomena, then, without further ado, a whole range of phenomena would be excluded. At the limit, imposing no more than mere extensional adequacy on a grammar would render the study of grammar to be the study of any symbol system at all, invented or not, and so what is peculiar about human language, as revealed by the WhyNots, would be missed (113). This methodological principle has especial pertinence to the status of Large Language Models vis-à-vis natural language, for the systems could be as easily trained up on unacceptable constructions as acceptable ones, and so they fail to reflect the peculiar character of natural language. The reason is that humans cannot acquire just any symbolic system under the conditions of normal language acquisition. This fact relates to the second feature of Rey’s discussion I’d like to highlight.

The second (‘philosophical’) part opens with a splendid discussion of the ‘grades of nativism’, which is the most sophisticated philosophical discussion of the topic of which I am aware. Rey first notes that the contrast between learnt and innate ‘is not a happy one’ (152), for it invites the thought that whatever is innate is exhibited independently of any experience. The real contrast is between aspects of a competence or capacity that are explained by an agent’s initial state and those explained by the contingencies of the course of experience. So, if we assume that UG is an initial linguistic state, then a theory of learning is still required to explain how an agent can go from UG to a final competence via experience (157). The point, however, is that, with UG in place, it imposes certain constraints and options that are invariant over great differences in experience, and so it explains how language is acquired in the face of a ‘poverty of stimulus’.

Rey offers a limpid run through of the many issues that have arisen over the claim of linguistic nativism, especially pertaining to the plausibility of what Rey calls a GenStat approach. On this view, a child induces the relevant grammatical principles from the data to which she is exposed. There is much to be said in response to this view, not least that the models which theorists appeal to have far greater data (in quantity and variation) than any child has and that children appear to be indifferent to much data when available. The highlight, however, is Rey’s discussion of two related conceptual problems.

Rey first invokes Leibniz’s claim that modal truths relating to what is necessary or impossible cannot be induced from instances, for no amount of positive/negative instances could entail the modal claim. At best, the instances could only support a claim of high probability, which is not what the target modal claim expresses. As Rey puts it:

to learn that one cannot say *Who do you think the pictures of scared Mary? It is not enough never to have encountered an utterance of it [. . .] mere (non-)utterance is far from being either necessary or sufficient for learning that some string of words is grammatically proscribed [. . . .] It is not that violations of, for example, island, contraction, and negative polarity constraints are improbable; it is that they are in an important way impossible. (173–4)

The point here is not that the child sees the grammar as a realm of necessary truth of the kind Leibniz and other 17th century rationalists had in mind, but that the child is sensitive to factors that go beyond the contingency of their experience in appearing to be law-like. Yet by definition, GenStat approaches can only appeal to factors that effectively reduce to a statistical signature. This is not to suggest that, say, island constraints are necessary truths, for it is easy to imagine a language not cleaving to any such constraints. The point is that as regards speakers’ judgements, they have a modal status. 

The point is driven home by Rey’s second conceptual objection derived from Quine (175–6). The objection here is that there is just no way to distinguish between the factors that contribute to linguistic performance from the viewpoint of recovering statistical patterns. In other words, if the phenomena of language just are regularities, then there is simply no determinate grammar at all, in which case there is nothing to induce at all, and one is left with a naked behaviourism. The whole point of the GenStat approach, however, is to show that the relevant grammatical categories can be induced, not eliminated. As far as I am aware, this is a novel point, and it cuts deep into the GenStat approach.   

In light of the current excitement around AI language models, Rey’s arguments are all the more valuable, although, sad to say, some of the fundamental points go back centuries. It is presently unclear if we are in the tragedy or farce stage of history.

The third part of the book is concerned with intentionality. From a philosophical perspective, the issue would appear to loom large, for Chomsky’s long-standing claim is that the competent speaker-hearers realise a computational system defined over representations of syntactic structure. Representation would appear to involve intentionality (‘aboutness’), but, notoriously, it is hard to make sense of intentionality in kosher naturalist terms: a symbol being about something appears not to be reducible to familiar non-intentional relations (spatio-temporal causal ones). Over the years, Chomsky has said little about what representation amounts to, whereas Jerry Fodor and others, inspired by Chomsky, pursued the attempt to ‘naturalise’ representation. As Rey explains (272–4), by the late 90s Chomsky did start to speak about intentionality although in ways that resonated with an eliminativist position, quite at odds with the approach adopted by Fodor and others (intentional vocabulary was likened more to literature than science). Rey offers a lengthy and detailed response, which, while arriving at very different conclusions from Chomsky, is sensitive to the deep waters hereabouts and the peculiarity of the linguistic case as an example of representational content.

A representation is a representation of something. Yet if Chomsky is right, what Rey calls ‘standard linguistic entities’ (SLEs) are not things out there in the world. If so, then how can SLEs be the represented? Rey diagnoses much of Chomsky’s animus to intentionality as being a response to the inflated role externalism has played in theorising about representation, which has encouraged the idea that whatever is represented must be. In contrast, Rey’s chief claim is that the representations involved in linguistic cognition are representations of inexistents (292). SLEs don’t exist in any way, shape, or form, but remain the contents of representations. Philosophers tend to pick Santa Clause or phlogiston as examples of intentional inexistents, but Rey’s lead example are Kanizsa triangles and other such visual cases: we surely represent a triangle, but there is no triangle at all, not even three lines.

A whole range of issues arise, both regarding the inner workings, as it were, of linguistics and psychology, and the philosophical status of intentionality and the inexistent. Rey does a fine job of motivating his position, and any reader should be left entertaining Rey’s view as a serious proposal. Still, I have my qualms, only three of which I can voice here.

First, Rey steers clear of any general definition of intentionality; instead, he treats the topic as one awaiting clarification, which does not impugn its necessary role in capturing a range of phenomena (292, 336, 343–4). As a general attitude to matters scientific this is clearly the right attitude. For example, Berkeley’s early criticism of the foundations of calculus was substantially correct insofar as there was no coherent definition of continuity, but his general rejection of calculus was hardly warranted. One might wonder, however, if such an attitude is appropriate in the present context, even if it is legitimate elsewhere. Intentionality has been with us since Parmenides, and certainly since Aquinas. It is not akin to continuity or gene, theoretical notions introduced for specific purposes. The complaint I have in mind, though, is not that Rey should offer a general account of intentionality, but that he, in effect, excludes various extant accounts that are incompatible with what linguistics might require. For example, on a broadly Meinongian view, (merely) intentional objects do exist, and if this view is transplanted to linguistics, then the result is a Katz-style Platonism, which Rey otherwise rejects.  Similarly, some philosophers hold that intentional existence is a form of pretence, but the speaker-hearer is not pretending anything when it comes to linguistic representation, even if, as Rey suggests, the theorist is pretending when she detaches SLE content from its representation (213). In short, if intentional inexistents are to be wheeled out for linguistics, then the operative desideratum is not, indeed, some general clarification, which might be at odds with what linguistics requires, but some particular account of the phenomena for which intentionally is putatively required. But if so, then all a priori bets are off when it comes to precisely what notion of representation the linguist presupposes. Minimally, Chomsky is simply keen to show that the kind of intentionality that typically concerns philosophers doesn’t arise in linguistics, regardless of the ultimate standing of intentionality as a general notion of ‘aboutness’. In other words, if intentionality is really a cover term for a range of domain-specific notions, then perhaps in the language case intentionality gives way to a wholly structural notion at odds with how it is best conceived in other domains.

Rey might complain, however, that he does do precisely the required work in his discussion of how SLE content arises. This leads to my second concern. Rey puts forward an interesting view of how representations of SLEs might be explained, where the acoustic stream doesn’t contain any SLEs. The view is a variation on Fodor’s core asymmetric dependence idea (316–9/372–6) and works via idealised phonemes (as found in the IPA), which might be probabilistically registered perceptually, and then associated with lexical entries. At best, though, this offers a view of the representation of what we might think of as words (qua intentional inexistents). It remains unclear how it could be scaled up to account for linguistic ‘entities’ that lack phonemic content (e.g., syntax and various ‘covert’ items). Rey can appeal to ‘Ramisification’, under which any theoretical (/a-phonemic) concepts might be understood content-wise in terms of the theory as a whole along with its observation terms (/those with phonemic content) (343–4). But such a view gets the nature of the a-phonemic content wrong. For example, all syntactic properties are independent of both the particular phonemic properties in this or that language, but are also modality independent in the sense of being invariant across speech, sign, and, presumably, thought. Tethering these properties to the kind of phonemes (even if idealised) a speaker might register denudes them of the explanatory work they are supposed to perform across the full spectrum of speakers.

Thirdly, even if some respectable notion of the intentional inexistent is available and can be attributed as content to speaker-hearers’ linguistic representations, one might wonder what explanatory obligation is satisfied by such content. After all, Chomsky and some fellow travellers (including myself) have contended that linguistic theory can get by without any commitments to the intentional (at least as traditionally conceived). Rey’s guiding principle is that ‘intentionality is needed where mere transduction gives out’ (91). The point here is that we appear to show great sensitivity to what Rey calls ‘abstruse properties’, i.e., those that are wholly causally inert (numbers, shapes, and other abstracta are the go-to cases). Qua abstruse, our sensitivities to the properties cannot be rendered transductively, and so it would appear that we are sensitive to representations of x as opposed to x itself. Crucially, Rey thinks that SLEs are abstruse too. For example, a verb, qua verb, cannot cause anything, but a verb representation might. There is much to say here, but in the space available I shall focus on an application of this general idea in terms of what Rey expresses as the need for a ‘common coin’ with which different cognitive systems might trade; that is, interface relations can’t be merely transductive or causal, for the relevant categories involved are not causally active as such (284–6).

There seems to be something clearly right here, in the sense that speaker-hearers hear, produce, and think of the very same SLEs, and so the different systems involved all must be ‘legible’ to each other in ways that can’t be merely adventitious or probabilistic or apparently causal.

But what precisely follows from this ‘common coin’ desideratum? There is certainly the need to talk of a ‘common coin’ (the same SLE can be heard and uttered), but this might be talk of an effect of a system interface rather than be explanatory of the interface. That is, perhaps ‘common coin’ content is not required to specify or to explain the interface arrangements, but is required only to generalise over them, an artefact of our theorising rather than what our theorising is about. For example, I take it to be a given that not all syntax contributes to parsing (e.g., unvalued case features, intermediate copies, etc.), but, if so, here there would at best be ‘partial coins’, as it were, reflecting some interface arrangement rather than a shared content between grammar and perception.

Moreover, substantial work on interface issues in linguistics does not typically trade in ‘common coins’. For example, a major question has been how hierarchical syntax can be translated into linear phonemic representations. One seminal answer has not been to posit a ‘common coin’ shared by both systems, but to define an algorithm that maps hierarchical relations (asymmetric c-command) onto relations of precedence (Kayne, 1994). Similarly, the significance of the hierarchical relation of c-command for binding construal is plausibly mediated by an algorithm that determines options of coreference (Reinhart, 2006). Chomsky’s own work of late has focused on the formulation of a ‘labelling algorithm’, which assigns categorical information to a structure on the basis of ‘minimal search’ for a lexical head; in effect, the proposal separates composition from projection, rendering composition an interface phenomenon whereas X-bar theory simply stipulates their concordance (Chomsky, 2008, 2013; cf., Cecchetto, C. & Donati, 2015).

The moral of these examples is that interfaces should be understood in terms of independent procedures that effect a mapping of distinct structures. Thus, even though precedence, reference, and labels are not aspects of the syntax, properties of the syntax do determine such properties in systems with which the syntax interfaces, but only thanks to an independent procedure that just amounts to the interface. In this light, there is no transduction, but nor is there a common coin that enters into an explanation of the interfaces; the common coin is an effect of systems being legible to one another via independently specifiable procedures. If this sort of view is right, content is ‘deflated’ to the role of what Frances Egan (2020) calls a ‘gloss’, i.e., the language by which we understand the role of a system in a wider assemblage of systems and in relation to its environment, but none of these relations require content for their explanation, computational or otherwise. As mentioned, though, Rey does have a range of considerations that merit careful and independent consideration.

These are qualms, for the volume is so admirable in its conception and execution that my complaints only arise internal to the framework that Rey articulates. The book should be read by Chomsky’s advocates and critics alike; both will have much to learn and ponder.  


Cecchetto, C. & Donati, C. 2015: (Re)labelling. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Chomsky, N. 2008: “On phases”. In R. Freidin, C. Otero & L. Zubizarreta (Eds.), Foundational Issues in Linguistic Theory. Essays in Honor of Jean-Roger Vergnaud (133–166). Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Chomsky, N. 2013: Problems of projection. Lingua, 130, 33–49.

Egan, F. 2020: “A deflationary account of mental representation”. In J. Smortchkova, K. Dolega and T. Schlicht (eds.), What are Mental Representations? (pp. 26–53). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kayne, R. 1994: The Antisymmetry of Syntax. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Reinhart, T. 2006: Interface Strategies: Optimal and Costly Computations. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.