Republic of Equals: Predistribution and Property Owning Democracy

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Alan Thomas, Republic of Equals: Predistribution and Property Owning Democracy, Oxford University Press, 2017, 445pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190602116.

Reviewed by James Lindley Wilson, University of Chicago


In A Theory of Justice, John Rawls claimed that his two principles of justice did not settle who should own the means of production. A society could satisfy the principles through either a capitalist system permitting private ownership of the means of production, or a socialist system in which those means were owned by the state or by workers' cooperatives, as long as the society secured equal basic liberties, fair equality of opportunity, and the satisfaction of the difference principle.[1] In the revised edition of Theory, Rawls made clearer that his defense of the possibility of a just capitalist order was not a defense of "a welfare state": instead, just capitalism required a distinct social form, a "property-owning democracy" -- a form briefly mentioned, though not much discussed, in the first edition.[2] Rawls still affirmed the possibility of a just socialist order, but focused more on property-owning democracy.[3] Describing a property-owning democracy served his justificatory purposes -- considering the institutions required by the principles selected in the original position is essential to achieve reflective equilibrium -- and emphasized the radicalism of the capitalist implementation of Rawls' conception of justice. (Rawls considered it an "alternative to capitalism."[4]) His principles were not an apology for the Great Society, or even for more egalitarian welfare states in northern Europe, but demanded a much more egalitarian distribution of capital ownership.

Rawls' later writings on different economic systems raise several important questions. Most obviously: what is the difference between "welfare-state capitalism" and "property-owning democracy," and why is the latter superior? And is there any reason to prefer property-owning democracy or liberal socialism? This book provides answers to these questions, defending the superiority of property-owning democracy (POD) to liberal socialism and to revised or idealized versions of welfare-state capitalism. Sustained argument on these fronts is welcome, given the urgency of practical questions involving the aims of reform, and the relatively little attention writers have given to POD. (This has begun to change recently.[5]) The level of policy detail, informed by Alan Thomas's studies of historians, economists, and political scientists, is impressive. Thomas also argues that once we accept that justice as fairness requires POD, we can better respond to some major philosophical challenges to Rawls' theory of justice, including how best to interpret the difference principle; whether, as G.A. Cohen argued, Rawls' theory is indefensibly inegalitarian and his conception of justice adequate to protect the basic liberties.

The reader might doubt that working out the institutional implications of the principles of justice can do much to defend the principles from challenges directed at the principles themselves. But Thomas is explicit that the institutional or "background" context within which the principles will be implemented can contribute to the holistic justification of the principles and their implications (5, 44, 64, 121, 127). In Thomas's favor is the Rawlsian method of reflective equilibrium, which, as I mentioned, holds that the complete justification of a conception of justice requires evaluation of its institutional implications. Institutional specificity also allows us to test better the stability of a conception of justice (xviii, 104, 292). Thomas's holism is more ambitious, however, in the justificatory work that "contextual" implications are said to do for principles that are logically prior. Thomas believes that institutional context constrains the operation of principles. Given the right context, the operation of the principles will then be more defensible. Property-owning democracy is, according to him, the right context for Rawls' principles of justice. While his arguments on behalf of POD are thorough, and will be valuable for anyone interested in the practical implications of Rawlsian principles, I remain skeptical about Thomas's suggestion that this conclusion helps defend the principles themselves.

The book's subtitle is Predistribution and Property-Owning Democracy, and Thomas makes much of the distinction between "predistribution" and "redistribution." He favors the former, and many of his arguments rest in part on the fact that POD supposedly involves a predistributive, rather than redistributive, institutional scheme. Despite the centrality of the distinction to the book, I confess I do not really understand it. (The distinction comes from Rawls, so the fault may be mine rather than in our philosopher-stars.[6]) Rawls and Thomas both suggest that it is better to have fair institutions and rules in place "before" individuals engage in transactions, rather than allowing individuals to engage in whatever transactions they may, and then redistributing goods "afterwards" (86). The "ex ante" institutions predictably "pattern" market outcomes (in ways that satisfy the principles of justice) (89). This patterning structures the system in such a way that "pure procedural justice" operates: whatever the outcome of the structured process is will be fair, in part because was structured to produce certain patterns (25).

I sometimes hazily feel the intuitive force of this distinction. But its real meaning remains beyond my grasp. For any "predistributive" policy to operate at time t, isn't redistribution required relative to the outcomes of all economic activity before t? So what is "ex ante" for t is "ex post" from the perspective of times before t. Similarly, redistributive policies at t amount to predistribution for later time periods. (Predistribution is a continuous process. Neither Rawls nor Thomas endorse "starting gate" theories according to which there is a fair start at some beginning point and then no efforts at regulating economic activity later.) So what is the real difference?

The abstract question reappears at the level of policy. Thomas treats progressive income taxation as a paradigm of redistribution (86, 181). But POD includes not only income taxes (including on capital gains), but also various forms of wealth and estate taxes (e.g., 168, 308), in part to guarantee a social minimum (194). These forms of taxation have the same temporal structure as standard taxes on income from labor, in that they require payment after the wealth or income accrues, and thus are equally redistributive. Accordingly I do not understand how Thomas can claim that POD "requires no redistribution" (208). This matters, because reliance on redistribution is supposed to be a flaw of both egalitarian welfare-state capitalism (181) and market socialism (236-7, 243). Thomas's discussions of particular slates of policies are instructive, rewarding, and generally more fruitful than the abstract defense of predistribution against a supposed redistributive alternative.

Thomas argues that the slate of policies comprising POD can aid Rawlsians in neutralizing Cohen's most challenging criticisms of Rawls' theory of justice. Cohen argues that Rawls interprets the difference principle in a way that permits inequalities that are in fact unjust. Rawls appears to consider as "necessary" to improving the lot of the worst-off members of society -- and thus as permissible according to the difference principle -- certain inequality-generating incentives for some citizens to engage in greater economic production. Cohen counters that in certain cases, these incentives are not necessary, because the citizens in question could engage in such production without the extra wealth promised by the incentive. Thomas pursues David Estlund's argument that Cohen himself must endorse such incentives, because Cohen admits that individuals have a "personal prerogative" to ignore, to some limited extent, the requirements of justice when those requirements impinge on important personal projects.[7] Because citizens could claim the prerogative in some cases as a permission not to produce in ways maximally benefiting the worst off, incentives might be necessary to coax such production. Cohen responded by arguing that the prerogatives were limited enough that the inequality-generating incentives they would permit would be far less than those permitted under Rawls' interpretation of the difference principle. Moreover, said Cohen, an orthodox Rawlsian could not defend the incentives on the basis of the prerogative, because the idea that justice makes demands directly on individuals, that they may have a prerogative to ignore, conflicts with Rawls's claim that the principles of justice directly regulate only the basic structure of society.[8]

Thomas responds by arguing that there are many ways in which Rawls' principles place demands on individuals indirectly, through their requirements on institutions. Individuals have a natural duty of justice to maintain just institutions, and satisfying that duty will require them to develop motivations and dispositions that will also shape their behavior on the labor market (83-89). Thomas is right that, in this sense, Rawlsian justice impinges on the "personal" choices of individuals. But the question now becomes what inequality-generating incentives in the basic structure are necessary to maximize the position of the worst off, given the dispositions indirectly required by the two principles. For all that Thomas argues, the incentives (and resulting inequality) required could be considerable. They may entail much more inequality than whatever incentives would be necessary given Cohen's prerogative. Moreover, they would purportedly be justified entirely by the unwillingness of some workers to produce for the benefit of the worst off absent the incentives. (Thomas does not claim that such unwillingness is incompatible with the dispositions indirectly required by Rawls' principles.) It is this purported justification that Cohen rejects.

Thomas argues that, in a POD, there would be very limited inequality, and, given the greater bargaining power of all potential laborers, few inequality-generating incentives (90-91). I am not sure why greater equality would render inequality-generating incentives unnecessary or inert. If they would, then a POD would avoid Cohen's objections to such inequality -- no small conclusion. This defense of POD would not, however, vindicate Rawls' two principles as principles of justice in Cohen's sense -- as the true moral requirements on distribution. Cohen was always happy to concede that the difference principle might in some circumstances serve well as a "rule of regulation," or public standard to which we hold each other accountable.[9] If Rawls' principles endorse a POD involving no inequality-generating incentives, then to that extent they would be good rules of regulation. But Thomas misleads slightly, I think, when he claims that Cohen's "dispute with Rawls now becomes an internecine dispute about policy," about how to achieve "a goal that [Cohen] and Rawls share" (92). On the contrary, Thomas has shown that Rawls' principles support an institutional scheme that inadvertently satisfies a goal of Cohen's that Rawls does not share. This leaves POD open to Rawlsian demands for reform that would introduce incentives and inequality in order to benefit the worst off. Thomas has some good potential responses on offer, since he thinks most institutions of POD are necessary to satisfy the principles of justice other than the difference principle, and are to that extent non-negotiable. But Cohen's objections remain live in theory and probably in practice.

Thomas's language of principles-in-context appears again in his argument that Rawls' first principle, which requires a scheme of maximal, equal basic liberties, demands POD. He claims that implementing the difference principle in the wrong context would permit material inequalities large enough to undermine what Rawls calls the fair value of the political liberties (109).[10] This concern sounds odd to orthodox Rawlsian ears, since the difference principle cannot permit inequalities that would be forbidden by a prior principle. (The matter is more complicated for Thomas, since he rejects the lexical ordering of the principles (121).) The discussion is confusing at times, since Thomas frames his discussion in terms of the "failure" of Rawls' fair value requirement (105). What I think he means is not that there is anything wrong with that requirement, but that Rawls mistook what was required to satisfy that requirement. In particular, says Thomas, (1) preserving the fair value of political liberty requires substantial limits on economic inequality (perhaps stricter limits than the difference principle would impose on its own), given the tendency of the rich to use wealth to undermine political equality (111); and (2) respecting the difference principle requires that we "constitutionalize" certain elements of POD, or of its animating "principle of reciprocity" (123). These claims contrast with Rawls' "insulation strategy" (108), which involves insulating the egalitarian democratic process from the effects of material inequalities, through electoral laws including regulations of campaign financing.[11] The claims also play a significant role in Thomas's critiques of welfare-state capitalism and of John Tomasi's "market democracy," which purports to satisfy Rawlsian requirements of reciprocity through strict protection of liberties of property and contract.[12] Thomas complains that both alternatives to POD fail to protect the fair value of political liberties (in turn leading to the violation of other basic liberties), because they fail to constitutionalize limited inequality (172, 181-2, 301-4).

Thomas's first claim is plausible and important. Rawls recognized that equal political liberty might require substantial limits on economic inequality.[13] If the fair value of political liberties requires stricter limits on inequality than does the difference principle, this is an important finding. Our support for political equality in the robust sense entailed by the fair value requirement would commit us to radical economic egalitarianism. But this places considerable justificatory burden on the fair value requirement, and puts great pressure on Rawls' already controversial arguments for the priority of liberty, as applied to political liberties.[14] We need a convincing account of the value of political equality -- one convincing enough to support such radical conclusions. Appealing to widespread support for democracy in some uncontroversial sense will not suffice. Rawls' suggestive comments on this front are very brief, and require considerable elaboration.[15] Thomas's holism might help: since, according to him, no principle has priority, the fair equality of opportunity and difference principles could shoulder most of the burden of justifying narrow limits on inequality, with the fair value proviso only required to explain the last marginal limits. But argument is still required to show that robust democracy is important enough to support that last bit of egalitarian rigor.

Thomas's second claim, regarding constitutionalizing certain distributive elements of POD is more troubling. Thomas takes for granted that judicial enforcement of the relevant economic rights would be more effective than legislative implementation without judicial oversight. It would have been interesting to see Thomas engage more with skeptics who believe that judicial review tends to favor oligarchic interests, or at best has little independent effect on policy outcomes. Second, constitutional limits on democratic legislation limit the "extent" of Rawls' "principle of equal participation."[16] This is justified if necessary to ensure the greatest extent of equal basic liberties overall, but we need persuasive reasons to limit the extent of equal political liberties in this way. So defending the claim that judicial review produces better outcomes in basic-liberties terms is essential.

Thomas provides a more categorical defense of constitutionalization. He claims that, absent judicial protection, the well off could use democratic processes to strip the worse off of their economic entitlements (97). Their possessing this capacity would constitute domination of the worse off. The constitutionalization strategy, says Thomas, removes that capacity by removing certain features of POD from democratic debate (109-10). Here it is vital that Thomas defends a "liberal-republican" synthesis (chap. 1) that interprets Rawlsian principles with an eye to guaranteeing non-domination in Philip Pettit's well-known sense.[17]

There are difficulties with this argument. First, how do the better off have the capacity to strip others of their liberties, when there are democratic procedures subject to Rawls' proposed standards (public financing, rules against gerrymandering, etc.)? The better off do not have the (legal) capacity to engage in such abuses unless they gain the support of a majority of the population. Oligarchs can manipulate majoritarian circumstances in unjust circumstances, such that we can describe those oligarchs as having capacity to arbitrarily interfere with others despite the exercise of that capacity requiring the cooperation of many others. It is much less clear, however, that the rich would retain such a capacity in a society that otherwise satisfies Rawls' principles of justice. In such a society, widely available, good public education, among other things, would make the worse off much less vulnerable to oligarchic manipulation. So we could not say that the rich have the capacity to violate others' rights. Thomas suggests that the potentially dominating group is not a minority comprised of the best off, but a majority comprised of the best off and the middle classes, who have the capacity to team up and abuse the worst off (201). Such cooperative abuse is possible. But it cannot be the case that any time any collection of individuals could make decisions that have the joint effect of interfering with someone, those individuals thereby dominate. If that were true, then domination would always exist, including in Thomas's POD, because democratic majorities and judges together could decide to strip the poor of their liberties. This raises deep questions about the relationship between democratic institutions and non-domination. There is work to be done, building on or responding to Pettit's efforts to clarify some of these issues in On the People's Terms. Short of that development, though, I am not convinced by the case for constitutionalizing certain elements of POD.

Thomas's description and defense of the policies and institutions of POD is rich and rewarding. This includes a short history of the idea, and extended discussion of differences between POD and policies associated with welfare-state capitalism and market socialism. I am not sure if the comparison between welfare-state capitalism and POD is an especially fruitful one. (Essential reading on this point is Paul Weithman's review in this journal of a collection of essays on POD.) Whatever one thinks of that comparison, though, evaluating particular policies and institutions associated with either social form (for instance, universal basic income schemes) is unquestionably valuable, and Thomas executes this task well.

Of particular interest is Thomas's critique of mandatory market socialist schemes. These require that the means of production are (mostly) owned by the state or by worker's cooperatives. Building on the work of N. Scott Arnold, Thomas surveys several proposed schemes, and criticizes each in some detail.[18] One central line of criticism is that socialist schemes inevitably involve exploitation, either of some workers by others or of the public at large by the workers in particular firms. The discussion involves ambiguity about what, exactly, constitutes exploitation. Sometimes Thomas endorses what I will call a "macro-conception" of exploitation, according to which one is exploited if social cooperation in general is organized in ways that violate broad principles of reciprocity, to one's detriment (e.g., 30, 211 and 403-4 n. 4, 224). Elsewhere, he endorses a "micro-conception" drawn from Arnold, according to which exploitation involves disparities between workers' contributions to production and their compensation (221, 225). This equivocation raises the following dilemma.

If we use the macro-conception of exploitation, it is hard to see how a market socialist system could violate it, since by assumption it is a system that aims to satisfy Rawls' principles of justice, and thereby to manifest reciprocity in social cooperation. Part of the point of Rawls' theory of justice is to replace or reorganize micro-level "precepts of justice" such as proscriptions against denying workers the full marginal product of their labor.[19] We could translate Thomas's argument into a claim that market socialism will be less productive, and thus benefit the worst off less than POD. Exploitation would play no independent role in explaining this flaw. Alternatively, if we use the micro-conception of exploitation, then we do have an independent objection to market socialist schemes. Thomas also deploys the micro-conception in defending POD (164-65) and in criticizing universal basic income schemes (196). Now we need to ask how the anti-micro-exploitation precept is supposed to fit into the wider scheme of justification. Moreover, the precept raises questions about whether the more productive are micro-exploited by most redistributive (or predistributive) schemes (cf. 194). Finally, while it feels churlish to ask for more from a work already so broad in scope, it makes one curious how well POD schemes would fare under the (appropriately) exacting scrutiny Thomas gives market socialist proposals given the worker- and firm-level incentives involved. (Thomas endorses non-domination requirements on firms (270); one wonders what perverse incentives or limits on productivity these might introduce.) Still, Thomas's discussion of the relative merits of POD and market socialism are well worth studying, particularly for egalitarians and those interested in justice in production.

Thomas's book articulates and thoroughly defends several important theses. First, though the difference principle does not rule out limitless inequality, in fact justice requires fairly strict limits on material inequality. Second, justly implementing such limits requires the right to private ownership of the means of production, with actual ownership very widely distributed. Relatedly, particular policies Thomas associates with POD, such as individual demogrants, unit trusts run by the state, and publicly tradable equity in firms, are (if implemented together) better at achieving egalitarian aims than alternatives associated with welfare-state capitalism or mandatory market socialism. These theses are of great concern to theorists of justice and to those interested in the goals of egalitarian reform. Given the great breadth of this work, it is hard to imagine a reader who will not find much to learn from Thomas's remarkably well-informed treatment of these pressing matters.

[1] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Belknap Press, 1971), §42.

[2] John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (rev. ed.) (Belknap Press, 1999), p. xiv. Rawls described the economic system sketched in section 43 of Theory as a property-owning democracy. See p. 274 & n. 14 in the original edition.

[3] John Rawls, Justice as Fairness (Belknap Press, 2001), §§41-42, 49.

[4] ibid., pp. 135-36.

[5] Martin O'Neill and Thad Williamson, eds., Property-Owning Democracy: Rawls and Beyond (Wiley-Blackwell, 2012); Paul Weithman, "Review of Property-Owning Democracy: Rawls and Beyond." Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews 2013.08.07; Samuel Freeman, "Property-Owning Democracy and the Difference Principle." Analyse & Kritik 35 (2013): 9-36. A valuable early piece is Richard Krouse and Michael Macpherson, "Capitalism, 'Property-Owning Democracy' and the Welfare State," in Guttman, ed., Democracy and the Welfare State (Princeton University Press, 1988).

[6] E.g., Justice as Fairness, p. 139. The issue is confused in Rawls' discussion because the critique of "ex post" redistribution is targeted at welfare states that clearly violate his two principles of justice in several respects. It is not clear that "redistribution" per se is the culprit.

[7] David Estlund, "Liberalism, Equality, and Fraternity." The Journal of Political Philosophy 6 (1998): 99-112.

[8] G.A. Cohen, Rescuing Justice and Equality (Harvard University Press, 2008), pp. 387-94.

[9] ibid., pp. 7-8.

[10] E.g., Justice as Fairness, §45.

[11] See Theory (rev. ed.), pp. 198-99; Justice as Fairness, pp. 149-50.

[12] John Tomasi, Free Market Fairness (Princeton University Press, 2012).

[13] Theory (orig. ed.), p. 225. Rawls, like Thomas, expected that the two principles together would, in realistic circumstances, recommend institutions that would keep inequality low, despite not directly requiring such a limit. See ibid., pp. 157-58.

[14] See Steven Wall, "Rawls and the Status of Political Liberty." Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 87 (2006): 245-70.

[15] Theory (rev. ed.), pp. 205-6.

[16] ibid., p. 201.

[17] Philip Pettit, On the People's Terms: A Republican Theory and Model of Democracy (Cambridge University Press, 2012).

[18] N. Scott Arnold, The Philosophy and Economics of Market Socialism: A Critical Examination (Oxford University Press, 1994).

[19] Theory (rev. ed.), §47.