Rereading Ancient Philosophy: Old Chestnuts and Sacred Cows

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Verity Harte and Raphael Woolf (eds.), Rereading Ancient Philosophy: Old Chestnuts and Sacred Cows, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 307pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107194977.

Reviewed by Jay R. Elliott, Bard College


These are good times for ancient philosophy. During the past few decades, the field has expanded considerably beyond its traditional home territory of Plato and Aristotle and found rich material for intellectual exploration in the Presocratics as well as Hellenistic philosophers, Neoplatonists, and even the sophists. A series of wider philosophical developments, most prominently (but not exclusively) the advent of modern virtue ethics, has made ancient philosophy feel newly relevant to the discipline of philosophy more broadly. Even beyond the confines of the academy, ancient concepts such as "the art of living" and "the care of the self" are suddenly in vogue. Ancient philosophers should be feeling confident about their enterprise. Yet doubts remain. Oddly, they are apt to be nagged precisely by the longevity of their tradition, which seems to invite a particularly aggressive form of the old worry that philosophy makes no progress. As the editors of this volume put it, "Many of us privileged to study and teach ancient philosophy" have found ourselves confronted by a skeptical interlocutor who presses, "in incredulous tones," the question "how do you find anything new to say about material that is so old?" The editors and contributors to this volume propose to face this challenge head-on. They begin by conceding that the field of ancient philosophy is indeed full of "old chestnuts" (familiar passages that have been much discussed and debated by generations of scholars) and "sacred cows" (interpretations that have attained the status of unexamined orthodoxy). Their project is to show that the chestnuts are not so old as to offer no new insights, and that the cows are not so sacred as to invite no criticism.

Rereading Ancient Philosophy is dedicated to MM McCabe, Emeritus Professor of Ancient Philosophy at King's College London, and features essays by many of her former students and colleagues. The essays are a fitting tribute to McCabe's salutary influence on the field, in particular her sense of the value of philosophical puzzlement; her emphasis on reading as in itself a philosophical activity; her insistence on dialogue and conversation as philosophical modes, even where texts are not explicitly written in dialogue form; and especially her dedication to reading Plato's writings as engaged in dialogue with each other and with the writings of his fellow philosophers, both earlier and later. In keeping with McCabe's interests, the focus of the volume is overwhelmingly on Plato, with the result that the generic reference to "ancient philosophy" in the title is a bit misleading, as is the promise on the dust jacket that the book offers "a snapshot of contemporary scholarship in ancient philosophy." It includes a number of prominent figures in the field, but a true snapshot would require a much longer and more diverse volume than this one.

I belabor the volume's editorial set-up for three reasons. First, the set-up is unusual in proposing that we see the essays as unified not simply by a topic (ancient philosophy) or homage to a particular figure (McCabe), but by a certain methodological orientation, or at least a certain set of methodological metaphors. Second, the contributors have to an unusual degree taken this set-up to heart, so that almost every author explicitly frames his or her essay in terms of an "old chestnut," "sacred cow," or both. Finally, the results of this emphasis on method and its metaphors are rather mixed. I wholeheartedly agree with the editors' and contributors' sense that ancient philosophy remains as challenging and surprising as ever. But for this very reason, I am doubtful that the field requires any defense or apology in response to the skeptical interlocutor. I am accordingly suspicious of the particular emphasis that the volume's set-up places on the pursuit of novel and even paradoxical theses. (If any sort of response to the skeptic is required, it can only be one of getting the skeptic interested in the details of what ancient philosophers actually do. Without apology, many of the essays are in fact well suited to do this.)

The essays collected here make for generally rewarding and always provocative reading, but I fear that some of the contributions suffer from the pursuit of novelty suggested by the editorial set-up. This is particularly true in the case of those that take on "sacred cows." On the evidence of this volume, it is quite clear what one is supposed to do when confronted with a sacred cow -- namely slaughter it, in a ritual that might be construed as sacrifice, but that more often results in sacrilege. The essays that most emphatically take the slaughtering of a sacred cow as their mandate -- those by Amber Carpenter and Joachim Aufderheide -- are the least successful. The reason is clear: the idea that progress in ancient philosophy is currently being impeded by an abundance of widely-accepted but unexamined dogmas is a disfavor to the field and simply untrue. The most likely candidates for sacred cows in the field today -- such as "Plato's Socrates was a eudaemonist" or "Aristotle was a virtue ethicist," to take examples at issue in these essays -- are in fact simply vague formulas that function as the contested starting-points, not the dogmatic conclusions, of complex and diverse bodies of ongoing research. Authors who are in a rush to slay these sacred cows too often end up assigning a narrow, arbitrary or implausible meaning to these formulas. They then occupy themselves in attacking positions that, far from widespread, are in fact ones that few if any serious readers of the relevant texts actually hold. Along the way these essays raise worthy questions, e.g., what is the exact relation between the good and happiness, on a eudaemonist view? Does Aristotle apply his notion of the "mean" in the first instance to actions or states of character? But these questions would be better served by a more generous, open-minded and collaborative tone, instead of the rather condescending one of slaying your colleagues' sacred cow. (Richard Sorabji's essay on Alexander of Aphrodisias might seem to be an exception: he considers with subtlety and nuance the precise contours of the "influential" reading he opposes. But he has the good fortune, as he tells us in a footnote, of not attacking a "sacred cow.")

Happily, it is less clear what one is supposed to do with old chestnuts. The editors propose that the contributors "infuse" them with "new and unexpected flavors." The contributors often have their own ideas. Malcolm Schofield and Peter Adamson, for example, want to "crack" theirs. Charles Brittain likes to put his "under the hermeneutic microscope." Harte describes herself as "addressing" hers, which, depending on your view, is either an abandoning of the metaphor or an intriguing extension of it. (How would one address a chestnut?) While most imagine an old chestnut as a plucked or fallen nut, some imagine it as a living tree, which, though old, may still yield new fruit or cast a welcome shade. In any case, the main thing about old chestnuts, as many of the contributors note, is that they are "tough." Accordingly, the essays that take their start from chestnuts tend to involve more humble (and more fruitful) approaches than those that attack sacred cows. Among these essays, two approaches to old chestnuts work particularly well. The first engages most directly with the idea of "rereading," seeking to clarify puzzling passages in a given text by juxtaposing them with other parts of the same text in unexpected and illuminating ways. Perhaps unsurprisingly, given its peculiar combination of familiarity and density, Plato's Republic turns out to be especially rich in chestnuts of this sort. Thus the volume treats us to three outstanding essays on the Republic -- by Harte, Tad Brennan and Dominic Scott -- each of which demonstrates the value of putting the pieces of that most puzzling of books together in novel ways. Harte, for example, suggests that a key to understanding Socrates's distinction in Book 5 between knowledge and belief is to see him as there drawing on an account of powers that he had initially sketched back in Book 1. Brennan raises the profound but often overlooked question of how exactly the new political arrangements introduced in Book 5, such as the incorporation of women into the guardian class, are supposed to function within the city-soul analogy announced in Book 2. Scott suggests that the critique of imitative poetry in Book 10 can be newly illuminated by seeing how it depends on Plato's understanding of poetry as a civic and pedagogic activity elsewhere in the text. In each case, the author not only sheds light on his or her chosen passage, but also suggests new ways of thinking about the long lines of argument that hold the Republic together.

Another successful approach to old chestnuts draws on the notion of "conversation" in one of the key senses in which it figures in McCabe's work, namely as an invitation to place passages in Plato in dialogue with passages in earlier or later authors. In these cases, the juxtaposition of something familiar with something less familiar does indeed have the welcome effect of destabilizing our settled habits of reading and interpretation. Particularly illuminating examples in this category include Schofield's essay, in which he argues that the notoriously puzzling structure of the Cratylus becomes clearer when we see how Plato connects the theories of naming under examination there with epistemological and metaphysical positions that he associates with Heraclitus and his followers. In a similar vein, Brittain helps to make sense of the otherwise baffling poetic interlude in the Protagoras by juxtaposing it with a passage in Aristotle's Poetics, showing that Socrates's interpretive moves constitute a precise parody of a set of standard practices of poetic interpretation. Finally, Adamson argues that we have much to learn as readers of Plato by seeing how Plotinus read him, in particular drawing our attention to Plotinus's sensitive attempt to resolve seeming contradictions in Plato's various treatments of the soul, reincarnation and the afterlife.

In sum, ancient philosophers need not worry so much. Their discipline, old as it may be, is as fresh and vital as ever, as these essays amply attest. Even without slaying any sacred cows, their old chestnuts still give them plenty to chew on.