Rescher on Rationality, Values, and Social Responsibility: A Philosophical Portrait

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Nicholas J. Moutafakis, Rescher on Rationality, Values, and Social Responsibility: A Philosophical Portrait, Ontos, 2007, 251pp., $89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793633.

Reviewed by Roberto Poli, University of Trento


Moutafakis' book is the first volume of the new series "Reading Rescher", published by the German-based publishing house Ontos Verlag. The same publishing house is also busy with the fourteen-volume series "Nicholas Rescher Collected Papers". Both initiatives are most welcome. In fact, Rescher's astonishing capacity to publish asks for the availability of suitable landmarks that are able to give some orientation to the interested reader.

Moutafakis' volume is divided into eight chapters (On Rationality and Its Predicaments, The Evolving Nature of Personhood, Rescher's General Concept of 'E-value-tion', Rescher on Distributive Justice and Utilitarianism, Qualifying Preference and Practical Action, Personhood and the Absolute Nature of Morality, On Commonalities and Limitations of Scepticism and Relativism, and The Moral of Social Responsibility), plus a short Foreword (by Nicholas Rescher himself), a Preface, an Introduction, and a Bibliography. The last of these is a particularly helpful tool because it organizes Rescher's works in a series of well-structured sections: Works by Nicholas Rescher, Translations, Articles (further subdivided into Theory of Knowledge, Metaphysics, Philosophical Anthropology, Philosophy of Science and Technology, Ethics, Value Theory, Social and Political Philosophy, Process Philosophy, Pragmatism, Idealism, Metaphilosophy, Philosophy of Religion, The Philosophy of Leibniz, The Philosophy of Kant, The Philosophy of Peirce, History of Philosophy (Greek Philosophy, Arabic Philosophy, Other), Autobiographical and Autodoxographical, Philosophical Logic, Symbolic Logic, History of Logic), Discussions about Rescher's Philosophy, and Articles Dealing with Rescher's Work.

Moutafakis starts by mentioning Rescher's "studious and creative eclecticism" (p. 5), "his unique interpretation of idealism" (p. 6), his rejection of the correspondence theory of truth (p. 7), the "'transactional' character of his theory of cognition" -- that is to say the capacity of the mind to help make "sense of the world in terms of patterns of order, taxonomic organization of experience, explanatory frameworks, social categories and roles, intentionality and purpose, evaluative categories, etc." -- and "the present day perversion of pragmatism by some contemporary American writers", that is to say the fact that "they have substituted pragmatism's communal concern of "what works for us" with the egocentric concern of "what works for me".

Apart from these needed but rather straightforward elements, the volume summarizes Rescher's achievements on rationality, values and responsibility from the very beginning of his career.

In the following review I limit my critical observations to one issue only, the concept of person. In fact, possibly one of the most interesting aspects of Rescher's theory of values and ethics is the idea that "the ontology of person … is certainly not that of things but of processes" (p. 79). Ontologically speaking, a person is seen as a process. This presents both a global side (the "evolutionary character of personhood", p. 183) and a local side (as for the claim that "our personhood is ever so much more enriched or diminished by the degree in which we exercise the faculties which determines our personhood"). Apparently, this latter claim is not too far away from the old Aristotelian proposition according to which we become virtuous by acting virtuously and we become vicious by acting viciously.

However, I have failed to understand from the Rescher/Moutafakis account which properties are the constitutive properties of a person. The reference to Brentano and the role of evaluation in distinguishing and organizing values is cursory and less than satisfactory, in part because the references are very generic and none of his works on ethics is ever mentioned.  Apparently the difference between person as a psychological entity, person as a social entity, and person as an entity able to access values is never traced explicitly.  On the other hand, the problem of the nature of values and of our access to them reappears time and again as possibly one of the ultimate grounds for the constitution of the person, without ever being clearly delineated.

Not much is added to the recognition that "in a sense our values lay at the rock bottom of our intuitive disposition toward the world; they come to manifest our 'gut reaction' to that world" (p. 122), which is a correct claim but does not explain much. Less obviously correct is the claim that "ultimately values, though things sui generis to the mind, are 'made known' to us by the way in which an individual desires to direct his/her choices" (p. 121). Apparently, one may well recognize a value even if her choices run directly against it.

It would have been enlightening to discuss the relation between Rescher's claim that in respect to values "the voice of reason recommends rather than commands" (p. 89) and similar claims advanced by thinkers like Scheler or Hartmann. Unfortunately, their ethical works are never mentioned. Furthermore, an explicit consideration of their highly articulated idea of person (especially Hartmann's) may have proved substantially beneficial.

Unfortunately, Moutafakis' work remains on the surface and the author seems content to limit his analysis to a somewhat summarized paraphrase of Rescher's pages.

Let me conclude by noticing a few editorial flaws. Occasionally, the author misspells some names, as with Meinong's given name, which is alternately spelled "Alex" or "Alexis" (pp. 9, 250) and is never spelled correctly (which is left as an exercise to the reader), and as with Karl "Marks" (p. 139). Most of the formulas on pp. 124, 125, 126, and 127 systematically use " ' " instead of the sign of identity; note 65 on p. 59 reads "Add info", something which the author has forgotten to do.  More careful editing would have avoided these and several other infelicities.