Resemblance and Representation: An Essay in the Philosophy of Pictures

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Ben Blumson, Resemblance and Representation: An Essay in the Philosophy of Pictures, Open Book, 2015, 209pp., $23.41 (pbk), ISBN 9781783740727.

Reviewed by Valeria Giardino, Université de Lorraine


The name of the author of Resemblance and Representation is 'Ben Blumson'. It seems obvious that this is the case because there is an arbitrary convention stipulating the connection between the physical person being the author of the book and his name and surname; alternatively, a picture of Ben Blumson would be as such only if it resembles the author of Resemblance and Representation's physical appearance. This is the 'platitude' Blumson starts with: as he declares in the opening lines of the Introduction, his first aim will be to defend it from the objections of philosophers. Apparently, he suggests, only philosophers would dream of denying such a claim (which is incidentally not a reason to reject their objections tout court, since they raise valuable criticisms against commonsensical claims).

The detractors of the platitude about depiction as depending on resemblance base their criticisms on a close analogy between depictive and descriptive representation, by acknowledging that in both cases the nature of the connection between the representation and what is represented is contingent. However, Blumson's strategy is not to reject this analogy but rather to fully endorse it and at the same time to deny its being a reason for dismissing the platitude. As a consequence, the book proceeds along two complementary paths, one defending the platitude, the other defending the analogy between description and depiction: chapter by chapter the reader is guided towards the view that depictive representation is at the same time analogous to linguistic utterance and based on resemblance.

There are at least two evident merits of Blumson's work.

The first is his attempt to override the opposition between the two supposedly alternative views of depiction as based on resemblance and depiction as analogous to language. This is done by calling attention to the fact that both depiction and description are members of a broader category -- representation -- and focusing on their analogies and not only on their differences; notwithstanding, these differences are still to be acknowledged, and the point of the entire book is how to draw them correctly. Apparently, Resemblance and Representation is more "An Essay in the Philosophy of Representations" than "An Essay in the Philosophy of Pictures" in particular, as in the subtitle. If description and depiction are both representations, then they depend on the recognition of intentions -- in a framework strongly inspired by the Gricean analysis of communication and meaning; however, they are different because description is mediated by convention while depiction is mediated by resemblance.

In line with this approach, the second of Blumson's merits is to rely extensively on philosophy of language without for this reason renouncing the platitude of depiction as based on resemblance: depiction is a special case of speaker meaning and as a consequence its investigation results in a sort of 'pragmatics' for pictures. In order to unfold his analysis, Blumson takes into consideration views of language -- Lewis' among others -- that allow for extending the sense of 'utterance' to cover all actions, not only language but also communication in general, pictorial representation included. Philosophy of pictures and philosophy of language are thus reunited in a philosophy of 'representation' intended as transmission of information.

The first definition of depiction in the opening chapter, given to specify the subject matter of the book, is ostensive: depiction is a kind of representation and figurative painting and drawing are obviously depiction; however, figurative sculpture, photographs and maps are depictions as well. In fact, depiction may belong to many media: for example, despite the fact the music is in most cases neither depictive nor representational, program music is both. Interestingly enough, abstract painting is not depictive, and therefore it isn't considered (which confirms that Blumson's book is devoted to a philosophy of representations and not really to a philosophy of pictures). Starting from this definition, Blumson develops his analysis in steps, each time addressing possible objections and finally delineating a 'stable' view.

In Chapters 2 and 3, Blumson argues that depiction is a kind of intentional representation -- thus extending the Gricean analysis of speaker meaning in terms of intention to encompass depiction as well. Depiction is in fact a special case of speaker meaning: words produce effects on the audience insofar as the audience infers his or her communicative intentions in a speaker who conforms to some convention. In the case of pictures, the process is analogous but resemblance becomes a key ingredient, as the audience has to recognize the resemblance of the picture to what it represents in order to understand the intentions of its proponent. The analysis is thus put forward in term of the effects that pictures are intended to induce in their audience, by means of the recognition of the intentions behind their use. In fact, an utterance can be defined as any kind of action that is intended to communicate.

An analogy between depiction and description is possible, based on the recognition of intentions, and then the mediation is considered as being convention for description and resemblance for depiction. In general, resemblance has the role of facilitating the expression and the recognition of intentions.  As Blumson explains, the aim is to reduce depiction to intention metaphysically (but not epistemically) and to give instead an epistemic priority to resemblance over depiction. An important point that emerges as a disagreement ("about the details, not in the spirit" (p. 49)) with Catharine Abell's view of depiction is that it is still possible to depict something without intending to induce an effect in an audience: in fact, in some cases -- for example in a sketch or a doodle -- it is possible to consider the sketcher or the doodler as the intended audience of his or her own sketch or doodle. There are also other interesting consequences. Fiction, for example, is analyzed by substituting imagination as the intended effect in the analysis of speaker meaning: an experience of resemblance does not in fact require both the thing that resembles and the one that is resembled to be present. If this is the general plan, then all objections should now target the analysis of speaker meaning simpliciter and not its application to the case of depiction.

The following chapters explore the details of the view and are focused more on the defense of the analogy between description and depiction than on that of the platitude. Chapter 3 deals with the possible objection that what the artist depicts may not be what the artist intends to depict. Chapters 4 and 5 are devoted to a modification of the Gricean analysis of sentence meaning in a way that would allow resemblance to have for depiction the same role that convention has for description. Blumson considers depiction as a kind of symbol system without accepting--contra Goodman--that this would have as a consequence that depictive representation is arbitrary. Following Lewis, he distinguishes between the study of language in the abstract and of language in use. The platitude is a thesis about symbol systems in use: resemblance is responsible for determining which symbol systems in the abstract are in fact symbol systems in use. Here emerges the difference between depiction and description: depictive symbol systems are different in the way they are connected to the populations that use them. Indeed, the analogy between description and depiction concerns speaker meaning and not sentence meaning! In Blumson's terminology, it has to do with foundational questions ("about what makes it the case that depiction have the syntax and semantics they do" (p. 82)) and not with descriptive ones ("about the syntax and semantics of pictures" (p. 82)). Moreover, depictive symbol systems are pervasive but depiction can also come outside symbol systems, and this again makes a point in favor of the analogy between depiction as description: some spoken and written utterances belong to languages whereas others fall outside it. Pursuing the analogy between depiction and description, in Chapter 6 Blumson argues that no disanalogy between depiction and description can be drawn on the basis that language is in fact compositional while pictures are not. He defines three constraints that theories of representation are subject to--the finite axiomatization constraint, the mirror constraint and the structural constraint--and claims that compositional accounts depend only on the third. In a comparison with Roberto Casati and Achille Varzi's view as expressed in Parts and Places (1999), he defends the idea that maps respect indeed the structural constraint, according to which it is by rational inductive means that one can infer what each part of the map represents from the axioms of a theory of representation for those parts. Therefore, maps can be considered as compositional as well as language, and the difference between depiction and description must be sought elsewhere (back to the platitude).

It should be pointed out that the view of depiction as compositional might be of interest not only for a philosophy of representation, but also for positions in philosophy of mind such as that of Lawrence W. Barsalou (1999), who argues that cognition shares systems with perception both at the cognitive and at the neural level and is based on perceptual symbols, which are modal and analogical but nonetheless dynamic and compositional and not holistic and static (as physical pictures are usually considered to be). Barsalou's theory tries to provide a synthesis between traditional and grounding theories by retaining the symbolic functionality of traditional theories, and in this respect it is not that far in spirit from Blumson's objective to maintain the platitude of depiction as based on resemblance without renouncing to the power of compositionality.

The theory is finally set: the rest of the book deals with possible objections and open problems. Once again, Blumson presents a plethora of views coming from different areas of philosophy, which is indeed another merit of the book: his approach is in fact very 'interdisciplinary' within the distinct and sometimes disconnected areas of philosophy, exploring views coming from philosophy of language as well as from metaphysics. These concluding chapters, as the author himself points out, are the most controversial and possibly open to criticism. Chapter 7 pushes the analogy between description and depiction to the consideration of the counterpart of novel sentences for depiction: might the compositional nature of pictures explain our ability to understand new pictures? Chapter 8 is devoted to how the theory manages with the possibility of depicting inexistents, the possibility of depicting something without depicting something in particular, and finally with depictive misrepresentation. Again, the reply is based on intentionality in general, by applying a possible worlds semantics to the content of depiction. Blumson argues that such a move does not recant the spirit of the possible worlds framework and at the same time is consonant with the platitude of depiction as mediated by resemblance. Chapter 9 discusses the issue of pictures in perspective and the possibility of depicting impossibility: depiction is like thoughts and sentences, since it distinguishes different ways things might be. The last chapter -- Chapter 10 -- takes into account one issue on which the author has remained neutral in the previous nine chapters: if depiction depends on resemblance, and to resemble means to have properties in common, which theory of properties and resemblance is adequate for his view? In this last chapter, Blumson tries to avoid the ultimate traps that Goodman has set to jeopardize the platitude.

As it is evident from this short survey, Blumson's book is very rich.  By pursuing a clear target, he reviews many views on depiction and language and more, thus offering a work that is at the same time original and instructive. However, the argumentation is at times very dense and consequently possibly difficult to access for the not-already-informed reader.

The reliance on the recognition of intentions for depiction remains to some extent problematic. Depiction is an intentional representation. But what happens if the audience of some depiction is not anymore the same audience that was in the intentions of the proponent of the picture? For example, consider the paintings in the Lascaux caves. In this case, archeologists might see them as depictions (resembling animals) because they attribute to the authors some particular communicative intentions. But how can they be sure about the value of this attribution without being themselves the audience the authors of the paintings originally intended to communicate with? These difficulties all stem from Blumson's commitment to Gricean intentions. Is it really plausible that a joke is considered as such because of our recognition of the intentions of its proponent? A joke is a joke because it is funny, which is the reason why the audience laughs; it is only afterwards that one realizes the intention of the proponent of the joke to make the audience laugh (I heard this criticism from Kendall Walton, in a recent conference). Another difficulty comes from the comparison between resemblance and convention as mediations, precisely between resemblance and convention in use. Conventions are many times explicit and therefore easy to share; resemblances instead must be 'seen', and therefore they might be very subjective (Goodman would agree). Imagine that I see a portrait (intended to be a portrait) of Ben Blumson and I do not find that it resembles to Ben Blumson at all. How can someone contradict me and argue that I am wrong? However, if I'd said that Ben Blumson is called 'Ted Blumson', it would not be difficult to convince me that I am mistaken.

As a conclusion, I want to point out a final merit of Blumson's work.  He is on a mission to defend the platitude about depiction as based on resemblance and takes that to be at the heart of his encounter with the existing literature without adopting "a last man standing approach" (p. 13). As he himself explains, he does not establish his theory by refuting every other plausible theory and mentioning alternative approaches only when relevant to his point of view: the definition of the correct analysis of depiction leaves open the possibility of finding other analyses in other terms as long as they meet the desiderata of defending both the platitude and the analogy between description and depiction. The general impression is that Blumson works at creating new conceptual categories by better defining or redefining the old ones; moreover, he relates depiction to issues coming from philosophy of language -- via its communicative aspects -- and metaphysics -- via the correct definition of resemblance. This results in a more general, rich and very promising framework about representation in use, whose implications, consequences and limits are still to be assessed. I hope this will be matter of (his) further work.