Resemblance Nominalism: A Solution to the Problem of Universals

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Rodriguez-Pereyra, Gonzalo, Resemblance Nominalism: A Solution to the Problem of Universals, Oxford, 246pp, $52.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199243778.

Reviewed by Fraser MacBride, University of St. Andrew's


Overview. One philosopher’s sense of absurdity is another’s blind prejudice. Take David Lewis’ theory that possible worlds are disconnected spatio-temporal regions whose inhabitants we routinely discuss in ordinary modal discourse. Famously, Lewis’ theory met with an incredulous stare from those to whom it was presented. But Lewis faced the incredulous stare down. Following arguments where they led, he showed that his theory enjoyed benefits that outweighed the cost of offending intuition. In doing so Lewis exercised a liberating effect on contemporary metaphysics, blowing away the cobwebs of ordinary-language philosophy and making it acceptable for philosophers to advance bold and surprising claims about reality.

In Resemblance Nominalism (hereafter RN) Rodriguez-Pereyra follows Lewis’ lead, undertaking a commitment not only to the panoply of Lewis’ possible worlds but also facing down an incredulous stare fixed upon the contents of his own claims. Rodriguez-Pereyra recommends a species of resemblance nominalism, the doctrine according to which “what makes any particular scarlet is that it resembles all scarlet particulars, what makes any particular round is that it resembles all round particulars, and so on” (RN, p. 4). Historically, Carnap and H.H. Price advanced influential versions of this doctrine. But the ontological commitments of their theories differed radically from the species of resemblance nominalism Rodriguez-Pereyra develops and defends. The particulars of Carnap’s ontology were phenomenalistic—“full momentary cross sections of the total stream of experience” (see his Der logische Aufbau der Welt (Berlin: 1928), §67)—whereas the particulars of Price’s account were ordinary material objects—“a certain tomato, a certain brick, and a certain British post-box” (see his Thinking and Experience (London: 1953), p. 20). So far so Vienna Circle, so far so Oxford. By contrast, Rodriguez-Pereyra offers us resemblance nominalism for the 21 st century: the basic units of his system are temporal slices of actually existing particulars and their otherworldly counterparts (conceived à la Lewis) and, moreover, facts, ordered pairs and classes composed thereof (RN, p. 60, p. 84, p. 86, p. 99, p. 101, p. 171).

By advancing resemblance nominalism in this form Rodriguez-Pereyra seeks to avoid the difficulties that bedeviled the versions Carnap and Price advanced. He freely admits that the resulting system runs counter to deep-grained intuitions. By making a thing’s properties depend upon the resemblances it bears to other actual and possible particulars, this version of resemblance nominalism runs counter (e.g.) to our sense that only actual particulars exist and also to “our intuition that having a property is an intrinsic matter … something that does not depend in any way on how other particulars are” (RN, p. 201). Nevertheless, Rodriguez-Pereyra insists, the theoretical benefits of adopting his system outweigh the costs to intuition. For, he claims, the resulting system not only “solves” the problem of universals: it does so in a manner that measurably improves upon other purported solutions—ostrich nominalism, class nominalism, trope theory and realism about universals—solutions that debate has unduly privileged in recent years. Rodriguez-Pereyra concludes RN upon the reflection “Resemblance Nominalism not only gets a place in the Problem of Universals’ ’grand final’, it wins the contest” (RN, p. 226).

General Assessment. RN deserves credit for endeavouring to breathe life back into a venerable nominalist doctrine—resemblance nominalism—unduly neglected by recent debate. RN also deserves credit for making a bold and thoroughgoing attempt to address many of the difficulties that are usually thought to deal a deathblow to the doctrine. Issues of detail aside, there can be no doubt that if one is willing to grant the ontological and ideological resources RN presupposes, then Rodriguez-Pereyra has succeeded in addressing several significant objections to resemblance nominalism.

It is far from clear, however, whether one should be willing the grant the ontological and ideological resources RN presupposes. Carnap and Price sought, albeit in different ways, to construct accounts of properties upon minimal bases (momentary experiences, particulars that actually exist). Had they succeeded in the tasks they set—in pulling a rabbit out of an almost empty hat—then an intellectual feat of some considerable, even extraordinary measure would have been accomplished. By contrast, Rodriguez-Pereyra seeks to construct an account of properties upon a base that is profligate by comparison. As a consequence one is left wondering whether there is anything so surprising in the fact that property talk can be cashed out in resemblance terms when possible worlds are presupposed. The question needs to be asked: did the metaphysician squeeze the rabbit into the hat before pulling it out?

The difficulties that Rodriguez-Pereyra encounters in this regard are general and apply to other metaphysical doctrines that presuppose the possible-worlds framework. The framework is so rich that it is questionable just how much is ever to be accomplished by its employment. It is instructive to compare the use of possible worlds in philosophy with the use of set theory in mathematics. From the mathematical point of view it is hardly news that this or that mathematical structure can be modelled in set theory. This is something the working mathematician takes for granted. Moreover the fact that the set-theoretic universe is rich enough to ensure this will often do little to settle the foundational issues that arise. If, for example, one has doubts concerning zero or aleph zero it will hardly help to learn that these notions can be captured in set-theoretic terms.

But even if it is legitimate to raise such doubts, there is no denying that the species of resemblance nominalism RN advocates is both novel and daring. To appreciate this it is important to understand how RN responds to some of the objections usually considered fatal to the view. Here attention will be confined to three such objections: (i) the co-extension problem, (ii) Russell’s regress argument against nominalism, and (iii) the problem of imperfect community. These do no exhaust the objections discussed and addressed in RN; these also include (iv) the problem of co-companionship and (v) the mere-intersections difficulty (RN, pp. 149-155, 177-185, pp. 186-198). Nevertheless a consideration of (i)-(iii) will enable us to appreciate the kinds of strategies RN deploys and get to the heart of what resemblance nominalism à la Rodriguez-Pereyra is about.

(i) The Co-Extension Difficulty. According to Rodriguez-Pereyra’s initial characterisation, “Resemblance Nominalism says that a particular that is F and G, is F by virtue of resembling all the F particulars and G by virtue of resembling all the G particulars” (RN, p. 96). F and G are different characteristics because what makes a particular F is different from what makes it G, namely the bearing of different relations of resemblance to different pluralities of particulars (the F s and the G s respectively). But now suppose that although the characteristics F and G are different they are also co-extensive. Then all F particulars are G particulars and vice versa. It appears to follow that resemblance nominalism cannot distinguish between the characteristics F and G. For there is neither an F particular that is not G nor a G particular that is not F by virtue of a resemblance to which a particular’s being F is distinguished from its being G. Consequently resemblance nominalism appears to rule out the possibility of co-extensive properties. Since the possibility appears to be genuine, so much the worse for resemblance nominalism. This is the co-extension difficulty (RN, p. 96).

Rodriguez-Pereyra seeks to resolve this difficulty by expanding the resources available to resemblance nominalism. He claims, in fact, that resemblance nominalism “can only accommodate the possibility of coextensive properties by adopting Realism about Possible Worlds” (RN, p. 99). Once other possible worlds, as real as our own, are admitted the resemblance nominalist is able to say: “what makes a particular F is that it resembles all possible particulars” (RN, p. 99). Since there are possible particulars that are F but not G, or G but not F, the characteristics F and G may be distinguished even when co-extensive. For even when F and G are co-extensive, a particular is F by virtue of resembling one plurality of possible particulars and G by virtue of resembling a different plurality. Of course, this proposal still conflicts with the possibility of necessarily co-extensive properties (where every possible F is a G and vice versa). But Rodriguez-Pereyra rejects this possibility, on the grounds that “any apparent example is in fact just a case of semantically different predicates applying in virtue of one and the same property or relation” (RN, p. 100).

(ii) Russell’s Regress Argument. In The Problems of Philosophy (London: 1912) Russell mounted a famous attack on resemblance nominalism. This doctrine claims that a white patch is white because it resembles other white things. But since there are many white things “the resemblance must hold between many pairs of particular white things; and this is a characteristic of a universal”. It will serve no avail to insist that these resemblances are themselves particulars. For then an infinite regress ensues: the resemblance between these resemblances will need to be accounted for in terms of further resemblances, and so on. Russell concluded that there is at least one universal that cannot be dispensed with, the relation of resemblance itself. And once one universal is admitted, Russell continued, there can be no theoretical obstacle to denying the existence of other universals.

Rodriguez-Pereyra reconstructs this argument in the truthmaker idiom. He endorses a general principle of truthmaking (RN, p. 39):

(T**) If E1 … En are joint truthmakers of ’S’ then ’E1 exists & … En exists’ entails ’S’.

Using (T**), Russell’s argument may now be expressed in the following terms. Suppose the sentence “a and b resemble each other” is true. Since a and b are distinct particulars it is possible for a to exist and b to exist without resembling each other. It follows that “a exists and b exists” does not entail “a and b resemble each other”. Hence a and b are not truthmakers for “a and b resemble each other” (by contraposition on (T**)). So the existence of some other item—a universal of resemblance that relates a and b—must be invoked to supply a truthmaker for “a and b resemble each other” (RN, pp. 115-6).

Rodriguez-Pereyra responds to this challenge by appealing to the counterpart theory that he takes to be a corollary of his commitment to Lewis-style realism about possible worlds. According to counterpart theory no particular exists at more than one world. It follows, Rodriguez-Pereyra maintains, that “if a and b exist only in one possible world and they resemble each other there, then ’a exists and b exists’ does entail “a and b resemble each other” (RN, p. 116). Hence, Rodriguez-Pereyra concludes, a and b do provide joint truthmakers without the need—contra Russell—to invoke the existence of a further resemblance universal.

(iii) The Problem of Imperfect Community. In The Structure of Appearance (New York: 1951) Nelson Goodman challenged resemblance nominalism in a different way. According to resemblance nominalism “resembling each other is what makes F-particulars have the property F” rather than F-particulars resembling each other because they have the common property F (RN, p. 142). This suggests that any group of particulars that resemble each other will thereby share a property in common. But consider the group of particulars R, S, W endowed with the following characteristics:

R: white; round; hard
S: black; square; hard
W: white; square; soft

Evidently R, S and W resemble each other, but they still fail to share a property in common. It appears to follow that resembling each other cannot suffice to make F-particulars have the property F after all. This is Goodman’s problem of imperfect community.

Rodriguez-Pereyra’s responds to this problem by appealing to the hierarchy of pairs of particulars: pairs of particulars (first-order pairs), pairs of pairs of particulars (second-order pairs), and so on. He claims that F- particulars have a property F in common not only because they resemble each other but also because their pairs resemble each other, and the pairs of their pairs resemble each other, and so on up the hereditary hierarchy. By contrast, a group of particulars may resemble each other but fail to have a property in common because some of their pairs, or some of the pairs of their pairs etc., do not resemble each other. So, contra Goodman, resemblance nominalism is not committed to saying that R, S and W have a property in common (RN, pp. 162-3).

This solution to the problem of imperfect community assumes that pairs in the hereditary hierarchy of F-particulars resemble each other whereas pairs in the hereditary hierarchy of R, S and W do not. Rodriguez-Pereyra seeks to legitimate this assumption by introducing a primitive resemblance relation R* that obtains between the former but never the latter pairs. R* is introduced in the following way. First, properties are bestowed upon pairs “by means of a function f(x), whose value is a class of properties of x when x is either a particular or a hereditary pair, the properties of hereditary pairs whose sharing is required by the resemblance relation the Resemblance Nominalist needs” (RN, p. 163). R* is then introduced by the biconditional (RN, p. 170):

(B) R*xy if and only if f(x)∩f(y) ≠ Ø

In other words, “R* obtains between any two particulars or hereditary pairs if and only if they share some property”. Since resemblance nominalism explains properties in terms of resemblance, Rodriguez-Pereyra assigns ontological priority to the left-hand side of (B); it is because R* obtains between particulars or hereditary pairs that particulars or hereditary pairs share some property (RN, pp. 171-2). He concludes that a class of particulars share a property just in case R* obtains between them and between their pairs, the pairs of their pairs, and so on.

Remarks on the Solution to Problem of Imperfect Community. There is evidently a great deal to be said concerning these different solutions but, for reasons of space, I will confine myself to some brief remarks upon this last.

First, by making the sharing of a property F amongst F-particulars depend not only upon the fact that they resemble each other but also upon the fact that all their pairs resemble one another (and so on), the solution to the problem of imperfect community appears to make a mystery of our capacity to perceive that F-particulars have F in common. This is because we do not—it appears—perceive that all the pairs in the hereditary hierarchy R* resemble each other; we perceive only the base particulars. Rodriguez-Pereyra dismisses this objection as a non-sequitur. For he denies that to perceive that a is F it is necessary to perceive what makes a F: “So, for instance, to perceive that something is gold or water one need not, and typically does not, perceive that the thing has atomic number 79 or that its molecular composition is H2O” (RN, p. 94). Yet one might grant so much but still insist that in order to perceive that a is F there must be an intelligible connection between a appearing F-ly and what makes a F. In the case of water, this connection is established by the fact that the molecular composition of water gives rise to its watery appearance. It is unclear whether there is any such connection between the resemblances that obtain amongst the hereditary hierarchy of pairs of F-particulars and the F-particulars appearing F to us.

Second, R* is introduced via a description that quantifies over properties and so treats them as values of functions and members of classes. This raises the suspicion that R* presupposes the existence of the kinds of properties that ground resemblances between particulars rather than providing a mechanism for dispensing with them. It may be responded that this begs the question because resemblance nominalism assigns ontological priority to the left-hand-side of (B), thereby allowing us to treat talk of such properties as an eliminable façon de parler. But this response too may be said to beg the question because it ignores the presence of the ontological commitment to properties incurred upon (B)’s right-hand-side. This suggest that we have arrived at an impasse over the interpretation of (B), an impasse that will only be overcome when we have available a neutral criterion of ontological commitment, a criterion that allows us to pinpoint when ontological commitments truly arise and when they are simply a manner of speaking.

Third, the proposed solution to the problem of imperfect community presupposes that particulars enjoy only finitely many (sparse) properties. For otherwise the hereditary hierarchy of pairs will—in conflict with the Axiom of Foundation—include infinitely descending chains (RN, p. 172). Rodriguez-Pereyra addresses this concern by denying that particulars could have infinitely many (sparse) properties. He offers two arguments in favour of this view.

Science endeavours to discover what sparse properties there are. But “if particulars could have infinitely many sparse properties then science would be a project in principle impossible to complete” (RN, p. 173).
Suppose x, y and z each have infinitely many sparse properties but whereas x and z share all their sparse properties, all sparse properties of y are properties of x but not vice versa. “It is clear that x and y resemble each other to a lesser degree than x and z resemble each other but since x and y share the same number of properties, infinitely many, which x and z share, x and y resemble each other to the same degree that x and z do!” (RN, pp. 173-4).

In response to (a) it may be doubted whether the scientific project is in principle possible to complete. Perhaps there are some infinite facts of which finite beings are destined to be ignorant. Furthermore even if there cannot be a finite list with a name for each sparse property, it does not follow that the scientific project is an empty one. For science might still succeed by schematic or quantificational means in providing a description of the general principles governing these properties. In response to (b) it may be said that if there are infinitely many properties then—as the so-called ’Paradoxes of the Infinite’ (better called ’the Cantorian theory of cardinal numbers’) show—the difference between sharing W and W+1 properties cannot be measured by counting. So (b) begs the question. If there are infinitely many sparse properties, then degrees of resemblance will have to be measured by some other means than counting (for example, by pointing out that whereas x and z share all their sparse properties, all sparse properties of y are properties of x but not vice versa).

Conclusion. The above discussion far from exhausts the list of topics that come under scrutiny in RN; Rodriguez-Pereyra also develops a novel understanding of the problem of universals, offers his own conception of truthmaking and examines the relative virtues of qualitative and quantitative economy. I am not convinced that resemblance nominalism wins the “grand final”. Even so, Rodriguez-Pereyra deserves praise for following arguments where they lead and challenging so many of the ingrained assumptions that metaphysicians routinely bring to bear upon the discussion of resemblance nominalism.

(I am grateful to the Leverhulme Trust for the receipt of a Philip Leverhulme Prize that provided me with the opportunity to write this review.)