Resistance of the Sensible World: An Introduction to Merleau-Ponty

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Emmanuel Alloa, Resistance of the Sensible World: An Introduction to Merleau-Ponty, Jane Todd (tr.), Fordham University Press, 2017, 128pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823275687.

Reviewed by David Morris, Concordia University


Emmanuel Alloa's insightful book compellingly shows how Maurice Merleau-Ponty's philosophy is oriented by a resistance manifest in things and the sensible world. This resistance counters philosophical efforts at seeking (at least in principle) fully clarified accounts of things, others, and ourselves. Where ideologies of transparency (12) encounter this resistance as a problem, Merleau-Ponty finds it integral to philosophy, animating philosophical questions and granting philosophy things to think about in the first place. In effect, Merleau-Ponty recasts the transcendental condition of philosophy as an as yet indeterminate resistance operative prior to philosophy that can never be fully exhausted by it. Alloa's conclusion pushes these results about resistance beyond Merleau-Ponty, to show how they require a methodological transformation of philosophy. Altogether, as Renaud Barbaras notes in his foreword, Alloa offers an innovative reading of Merleau-Ponty's texts that sheds new light on the possibilities of his philosophy, beyond Merleau-Ponty's own work, which was cut short by his death at the age of 53, in 1961.

This biographical fact has shaped Merleau-Ponty scholarship, since he published only two monographs on perception and ontology in his lifetime, The Structure of Behaviour (1942) and The Phenomenology of Perception (1945), with a third, The Visible and the Invisible, assembled by Claude Lefort from somewhat enigmatic working materials and published in 1964. Merleau-Ponty's thinking thus itself resists transparent or exhaustive presentation, and the secondary literature has been a dynamic field, transforming itself as new materials come to light, in what can be characterized as three overlapping waves of reception. This is worth mentioning, since it provides helpful context, especially for English readers, for understanding Alloa's contribution and the formation and character of his book.

Alloa's book, originally published in French in 2008 (by Kimé), belongs to the third wave of scholarship, enabled by the publication (starting in 2001) of volumes containing Merleau-Ponty's lecture notes, working notes, interviews, and other materials, on topics such as nature, expression, passivity and what he calls institution -- materials that afford new insights into Merleau-Ponty. Alloa's work on resistance is an important contribution that complements this third wave, shedding new light on the role of institution and passivity in Merleau-Ponty's philosophy, but also offering resistance as a conceptual key that unlocks new interpretations.

In terms of scholarship, Alloa's book also sits between the works of two central figures, Emmanuel de Saint Aubert and Renaud Barbaras, who respectively serve, within French scholarship, as avatars of this third wave and the second one leading up to it. Barbaras's 1991 De l'être du phénomène (J. Millon) had a transformative impact, worldwide, by illuminating linkages and tensions between Merleau-Ponty's later ontology and his earlier phenomenological work, but also opening a fresh approach, especially in France, to Merleau-Ponty's philosophy as a living whole. Barbaras thus culminates a first wave (starting, say, with Alphonse de Waehlens's 1951 Une philosophie de l'ambiguité) that explicates and assesses Merleau-Ponty's major books, and he signals the rise of a second wave that is prepared to synthesize, deepen, and advance underlying themes and unities of his work. Coming in the form of a series of books (beginning in 2004), Saint Aubert's work, which draws on archival materials and notes to shed light on Merleau-Ponty's sources and intellectual trajectory, is key to the third wave, as is his work establishing and publishing several recent volumes of notes.

Alloa's book is clearly informed by Barbaras's insights into ontological issues and tensions in Merleau-Ponty's philosophy, and his conceptual emphasis on distance, but Alloa also draws on Saint Aubert's materials and strategies, including his analysis of still unpublished notes. It is thus a high level contribution to scholarship. At the same time, though, it is accessible to a general philosophical audience, since Alloa conveys his complex points via careful support from texts and phenomenological observation, in a volume that is very clear (the translation is very readable and conveys the original well) yet remarkably concise -- but also potentially challenging because of this concision.

Indeed, it is only 101 pages long, consisting of an introduction to the theme of resistance, three chapters covering three phases of Merleau-Ponty's thinking, as a whole integrated around resistance, and a conclusion drawing out philosophical implications. Each chapter is between 14 and 25 pages and consists of a series of very short, 3-4 page, titled sections, each working as a sort of aperçu that crystallizes a conceptual point about Merleau-Ponty's philosophy by drawing on his texts and sources, and phenomena. While the subtitle of the French original is Merleau-Ponty critique de la transparence, the English translation has a subtitle, An Introduction to Merleau-Ponty. This could be puzzling, since it does not quite function as a standalone introduction to the content of Merleau-Ponty's corpus. Instead it works like someone who gives a great introduction to someone new by telling a bit about what makes the philosopher tick -- in this case how resistance is central to the thinking. Alloa thus gives an illuminating introduction to a driving point of Merleau-Ponty's philosophy -- but it is not simply a point for beginners. On the other hand, his book does read a bit like an introduction, in the sense of a compendium of concepts crucial to a body of thought -- only in this case the compendium is cut to Alloa's thesis. Readers, though, would have to read Barbaras, Saint Aubert, and other French scholarship (only two works by English scholars are cited, Gary Brent Madison and Aurora Plomer) to fully understand the book, which is as much informed by what it leaves out as what it leaves in. Also, while each short section is very successful in conveying its point, Alloa's compact exposition swiftly skips from section to section, and the reader has to do some work to see the forest in these trees.

Alloa's introduction begins, in its first section, by drawing out Merleau-Ponty's challenge to the sort of philosophy that would seek to begin with what is "obvious," and that would find perception a challenge, because it is muddled and not transparent to our analyses. But, as Alloa observes (with Husserl), the "problem with the obvious is that it is considered unproblematic" (3). Alloa's second section thus proposes a return to adversity, to "what is in the way" -- what is obvious in the sense of standing out by also getting in the way. ("Didn't you see you that problem coming up? Wasn't it obvious?!")

In Merleau-Ponty, Alloa finds a reworking of the problem of the obviousness with which philosophy and science must begin: the obvious is no longer something transparently available for experience and analysis, but what obtrudes by standing in the way of our very access to things, yet is the very medium of that access. This is what Merleau-Ponty finds in the "resistance of the sensible," which indicates the sensible as our obvious access point to everything that yet stands in the way of our immediately getting to things. (Depth is a classic example for Merleau-Ponty: we sense things in depth only because our access to them inherently obscures or occludes them.)

After brief remarks on how our reading of Merleau-Ponty must also not plunge into the obvious, but restore resistance to his texts, Alloa turns to Chapter 1, "Perception," which shows how Merleau-Ponty discovers resistance within perception itself, and thereby transforms the sense of the transcendental. The first section of this chapter locates this perceptual project in the Structure of Behaviour and Phenomenology of Perception as a unity, in which Alloa rightly sees Structure as doing negative clearing work, and Phenomenology doing positive work (16-17). Together these identify perception as the proper resistance point for scientific and philosophical beginnings. The consequence, though, is drawing this resistance into philosophy itself -- a key move and result deepened in the course of Alloa's book.

The next two sections show how this move plays out in Structure, basically by showing how living phenomena preclude analysis in terms of simple causal relations in transparent orders of space and time, and instead structure themselves as Gestalt wholes that distribute across the organism and its milieu. Any analysis of salient features or behaviours of organisms must, then, already have found itself beginning by and through an orientation to fields of resistance that are not up to us to define, or to decompose by imposing our own conceptual terms upon them.

The fourth section shows how the Phenomenology rediscovers this sense of resistance in our own lived body, as distributing across ourselves and the world. Sensible resistance thus infiltrates the traditional last refuge of philosophical scoundrels who would (wrongly, albeit astutely, according to Merleau-Ponty) seek to begin inside what Heidegger famously called "the cabinet of consciousness," which would be closed to the obtrusive resistance of the outside world and thus afford an "I think" transparent to itself. In the last section, Alloa shows how this leads Merleau-Ponty to transform the very idea of a transcendental, from a pre-given a priori, fixed in advance, into an unsurpassable field through which alone we can begin and access philosophical problems. This field is a source of indetermination, of possible movements, not firm and transparent foundations. Altogether, this analysis encapsulates important lines of Merleau-Ponty's thinking in an extremely helpful way.

Chapter 2, "Language," captures the similar line of thinking in the linguistic domain, picking up points about expression in the Phenomenology (now well covered by Donald Landes and Véronique Fóti in English, and Stefan Kristensen in French), integrating these with Merleau-Ponty's forays into language via Ferdinand de Saussure (now elaborated by Beata Stawarska), in order to emphasize the diacritical as key to Merleau-Ponty's thinking (cf. Toadvine 2015). Language articulates itself in a constantly dynamic movement, and it is not a transparently exhaustible system, even though it might appear that way to us. (Alloa helpfully refers to Merleau-Ponty's image of a drystone arch, in which the work of stones leaning on one another manifests as an apparently static structure that conceals its dynamic operation.) Alloa nicely shows how language, for Merleau-Ponty, effaces its dynamic and inexhaustible openness (51) -- leading us into another illusion of transparency within the very stuff of thinking. In the final section, Alloa articulates this via the theme of "laterality" in Merleau-Ponty, which conceptualizes terms (of being or description) as interlaced with, distributed across, and supported by other terms that run side by side (lateral) with them, and then beyond, within an open network that is never fully bounded or exhausted.

This groundwork gives a considerable payoff in Chapter 3, "Ontology of the Visible." This focuses on The Visible and the Invisible and related works, which are notoriously difficult because they are obstinately dedicated to seeking an entirely new way of conceptualizing being and doing philosophy, via Merleau-Ponty's poetically repurposing words such as flesh, chiasm, and reversibility to name new philosophical concepts. Given these complications, it is hard to lay out Alloa's insightful results in this short space.

Basically, he is able to show how these new words are directed to articulating those dimensions of resistance that Merleau-Ponty first found in perception as outer milieu, and then in language as inner milieu of outer expression. Here, though, the dimensions of resistance do not name aspects of perception or language, but of being. For example, flesh names an "embodied diacritical" (68): a diacritical that is only in being embodied (vs. being abstract, purely differential); an embodiment that is only in being diacritical (endlessly distributed via laterality, and hence resistant to transparency). (Barbaras approaches this in speaking of being as "non-coincidence.") But if philosophy seeks to conceptualize being as flesh, it must operate as hyper-reflection: reflection that must "dig down to the roots of embodied being," through which alone philosophy can operate as reflection (70). This means that the insides of philosophy cross-over with its outside roots, in a dynamic pattern that Merleau-Ponty conceptualizes as chiasm. (Alloa is very helpful in clarifying this term and its sources on pages 70-2.) Alloa thus shows how the resistance identified in Merleau-Ponty's earlier philosophy is pursued into and via the later philosophy -- and how key terms of that later philosophy can be figured out in terms of resistance. Alloa's 'resistance reading' of these ontological terms is a considerable contribution that complements recent efforts linking them to passivity and institution.

In his conclusion, Alloa argues that Merleau-Ponty's discovery of the resistance of the sensible as the inborn root of philosophy, entails a method Alloa calls "dia-phenomenology." Alloa here re-appropriates the logic of Aristotle's diaphane, the diaphanous medium through which alone what shows itself is able to show itself. According to this logic, appearances are not transparent to us but arise via 'transparence', a sort of transit through a medium that is integral to yet resistant to appearing. This transparence, though, effaces itself right within appearing. But this diaphanous medium is the inherent and informative milieu of phenomenology. So phenomenology cannot sit back to receive what appears obvious (in what Alloa calls an "oblivion of the sensible"): phenomenology operates via immersion in the resistance of being within which alone appearing can appear. His overarching insight is well captured by his note that Merleau-Ponty "ceases to define the perceptual object in terms of exteriority and henceforth determines it by its distance" (86). Transcendence does not attach to an object or its ontological location, but operates in and through its distance from us. This distance is engendered out of the medium through which we and objects traverse each other, via passage through material and dynamic differences that resist universalization. (This allows Alloa some deft and welcome broadsides against the charges of speculative realists.) This is a genuinely novel and important methodological result that opens philosophy to its outside, and deepens Barbaras work on distance. (Cf. also Edward Casey's recent 'peri-phenomenology'.)

Alloa's book will be an important touch point on themes of resistance, passivity, and method in Merleau-Ponty. For those new to the broader landscapes of Merleau-Ponty's work, beyond the pillars of Structure, Phenomenology, and the Visible and the Invisible, it gives helpful perspectives on what animates his work. For those tracking Merleau-Ponty into the wilds of his notes, it gives sharp insights into the thickets of resistance through which alone Merleau-Ponty pursues philosophy. It's a welcome contribution, and good to see in English after so many years. On the other hand, reading it in English for the first time, it puzzled me to see English scholarship bypassed, although perhaps this is more due to brevity than to design. Nonetheless, the resistance of translation, of bearing expression from language to language, from style of thinking to style, from one way of living to another, is perhaps the most beautiful, wondrous and powerful resistance so far born within being. Philosophy needs more of it.


Casey, Edward. 2007. The World at a Glance. Indiana UP.

Fóti, Véronique. 2013. Tracing Expression in Merleau-Ponty: Aesthetics, Philosophy of Biology, and Ontology. Northwestern UP.

Kristensen, Stefan. 2010. Parole et subjectivité: Merleau-Ponty et la phénoménologie de l'expression. Georg Olms.

Landes, Donald. 2013. Merleau-Ponty and the Paradoxes of Expression. Routledge.

Stawarska, Beata. 2015. Saussure's Philosophy of Language as Phenomenology: Undoing the Doctrine of the Course in General Linguistics. Oxford UP.

Toadvine, Ted. 2015. Biodiversity and the Diacritics of Life. In Carnal Hermeneutics, eds. R. Kearney and B. Treanor. Fordham UP.