Resisting Scientific Realism

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K. Brad Wray, Resisting Scientific Realism, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 224pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781108415217.

Reviewed by Darrell P. Rowbottom, Lingnan University


This book brings together and expands on material from twelve of K. Brad Wray's journal articles. Its overarching aim should be reasonably clear from its title (although, as I will explain later, Wray is not clear about what 'scientific realism' refers to). I will begin the review by outlining some of the strengths of the book, and then go on to make some criticisms. I will conclude by giving an opinion of the book as a whole.

The book is strong in its treatment of the core existing arguments for and against scientific realism of a traditional variety, such as: the no miracles argument, the pessimistic induction, the argument from underconsideration, and the argument from the exponential growth of science. It is well-situated in the relevant literature, and especially noteworthy because it credits many younger philosophers of science -- such as Dicken, Fahrbach, Ivanova, Mizrahi, Saatsi, and Vickers -- while nevertheless engaging extensively with the work of the several of the most well-known figures in the field, such as Laudan, Kuhn, and van Fraassen. Wray is especially strong on some areas of the history of philosophy of science. I was impressed, for example, by his understanding of Popper and by his discussion of Duhem's views on confirmational holism. This isn't to say that I agree with everything he says about such figures' views. For example, I don't agree it's 'roughly' right that Kuhn 'argued that a scientific revolution occurs when one paradigm or theory replaces another incommensurable paradigm or theory' (110), because I take Kuhnian revolutions to require changes in paradigms qua disciplinary matrices rather than theories. I also doubt that theories can be incommensurable when considered in isolation -- that is to say, without the context of background beliefs, shared methods, shared values, and so on. But disagreement on such matters is natural among historians of philosophy of science.

Wray also largely succeeds in defeating existing arguments for -- and defending existing arguments against -- several theses that have been advanced by scientific realists. For example, he refutes Lipton's objection to the argument from underconsideration (in chapter three) and Fahrbach's objection to the pessimistic induction (in chapter six). In between, he makes a good case that 'arguments for epistemic privilege are generally quite weak' (58, in chapter four); that is to say, where scientists having epistemic privilege would, roughly, amount to their being able to reliably generate true or approximately true theories concerning unobservable things. It also speaks to Wray's decorum that that he stopped short of declaring these arguments flimsy, which is what they really are. If their conclusions weren't so psychologically appealing -- weren't those of 'common sense' -- then far fewer philosophers would take them seriously. As I lack Wray's gentility, I enjoyed it when he was later more robust, in declaring that: 'realists tend to take for granted . . . the correlation between the various theoretical values and theoretical truth. Such claims are dogmas of realism.' (133) This is indeed the situation. You will search in vain for even a half-decent argument that they're correlated.

This brings me to my criticisms of the book. I will begin with the more general, and then move to the more specific.

One troublesome issue is that 'What is scientific realism?' isn't answered or even discussed. Wray succeeds in attacking scientific realism nonetheless, to some extent, in so far as he targets several theses often endorsed by scientific realists. But if endorsing such theses is not necessary to be a scientific realist, then refuting them is not sufficient to show that scientific realism is false (even if it shows that some forms of realism are false). For example, if one holds that science reliably generates theories that are closer to the truth over time and that empirically successful theories are probably much more true than not, but does not endorse the claim that empirically successful theories are probably approximately true, then might one be a scientific realist? Wray's treatment suggests he'd answer in the negative, although this is highly contentious. One should look carefully to the historical literature on the topic in order to answer such questions adequately.

Partly as a result of the aforementioned issue, Wray is also not clear about what scientific anti-realism is supposed to be. This problem is compounded by Wray's repeated claims about what 'the anti-realist' thinks, which don't respect the fact that anti-realism can take many different forms. Here are three examples. First, Wray claims that 'the anti-realists' permissive conception of rationality puts scientists in a better position than the directive conception of rationality' (140). But there is no need for an anti-realist to have a permissive (or 'English') conception of rationality. An anti-realist might have no view whatsoever on rationality; she might simply take a position on how science works and what science can and cannot -- or is likely to and unlikely to -- achieve. Alternatively, she might think that scientific realists are irrational, and that scientists who believe in the truth of well-confirmed theories are irrational (given the available evidence from the history of science and confirmation theory). She might grant, nevertheless, that it is good for science for some scientists to be irrational (e.g., dogmatic).

Second, Wray writes that 'The anti-realist . . . believes that the progress scientists make is with respect to their knowledge of the phenomena and does not necessarily extend to their knowledge of the unobservables.' (136) Again, however, this is merely something that an anti-realist might believe. An anti-realist is free to deny the very idea that science progresses in any objective sense -- as a Whig fantasy, perhaps -- and to avoid making claims about knowledge, in anything like the epistemologist's sense, to boot. For example, she might make claims only about whether the theories selected by scientists, or by some 'scientific methods', tend to be true, or approximately true, or more true than not, in what they say about unobservable entities.

Third, and finally, Wray opines that: 'anti-realists . . . acknowledge . . . the growth in our knowledge of the phenomena, but deny that the growth of knowledge is connected in any sort of significant, systematic way with changes of theory.' (204) Put any concerns about 'knowledge', which I've already addressed, to one side. An anti-realist could instead think that particular kinds of systematic changes to theories -- expressed, say, in terms of theoretical virtues -- are responsible for the fact that we can now use science to achieve more, say in engineering, than we could previously. And this is so even if one takes 'theory' to refer, very narrowly, to 'theories involving unobservable entities', as I suspect one should here. Indeed, Wray often uses 'theoretical' or 'theories' in this narrow and outdated way -- to refer only to claims (or discourse) involving unobservable entities. On page 58, for example, he equates 'theoretical knowledge' with 'knowledge of unobservable entities and processes'. Yet it's commonplace to think that theories needn't involve unobservable entities, which will make the discussion confusing for many readers.

Perhaps Wray's use of 'the anti-realist' and 'anti-realists' was stylistic and intended to encourage readers to sympathise with his personal views. But it does not serve that end. Instead, it muddies the conceptual waters. It is left unclear exactly what an anti-realist is putatively committed to, as distinct from what Wray is personally committed to as an anti-realist. Perhaps Wray has a distinctive position in the realist debate that is lurking underneath the discussion, but that's not developed.

I have two final general criticisms. One, which is connected somewhat to those already made, is that Wray doesn't devote sufficient attention to the alternatives to (traditional) scientific realism, such as structural realism (endorsed by the likes of French, Ladyman, Votsis, and Worrall) and semi-realism (developed and championed by Chakravartty). Is being an anti-realist different from adopting one of these views? Presumably Wray's answer is 'Yes', given some of the quotations above (such as the last one, which appears to rule out thinking there are significant structural changes explaining improvements) -- and Wray appears to be very partial to constructive empiricism -- but we are left to wonder how anti-realism (or Wray's favoured variant thereof) compares with these alternatives. The other criticism is that Wray doesn't tackle one of the core problems in the realism debate, namely the extent to which the distinction between the observable and the unobservable can be upheld and thought to have epistemic significance. For example, can't the range of the observable change over time due to the development of new theories (if observation is theory-laden) and instruments? What impact does that have on the debate? Wray only touches on these issues (on page 101).

This brings me to my criticisms of two specific parts of the book. It begins with a selective survey of the history of astronomy prior to and surrounding the Copernican revolution, which is intended to serve in an illustrative capacity at several subsequent junctures. Wray paints the history of astronomy over this period as instrumentalist in character, although he does not specify what he takes 'instrumentalism' to refer to. (He does, however, say that trying to save the phenomena without constructing any 'picture of the underlying causes of the phenomena' (10) counts as an extreme form of instrumentalism. I found Wray's characterization of 'instrumentalism' to be too narrow, when it eventually emerged in later chapters. But since I've already dealt with similar concerns about 'scientific realism', I'll say no more on this.) For example, he writes of late Ancient Greek astronomy, embodied in the work of Ptolemy:

This approach to model-building is clearly in the instrumentalist tradition. The models were two-dimensional . . . And generally it was assumed that these two-dimensional models did not describe the structure of the cosmos . . . Insofar as one worked in mathematical astronomy, one was generally an anti-realist, and often an instrumentalist . . . The aim of these models was to save the phenomena . . . Insofar as one worked in cosmology, one was a realist. (13-14)

However, it is rather implausible, in the absence of further argument, that these two activities -- mathematical astronomy and cosmology -- were so disconnected. Indeed, it seems imprudent to make claims about what was generally assumed, given how much dissensus there was in Greek thought, without deeply engaging with the history of science. Moreover, there are reasons for thinking that much mathematical astronomy was constrained, to some extent, by cosmological concerns. Consider, for example, the central role that circular motions played in astronomy until Kepler's work, despite conic sections having long been known about (via, say, Appolonius of Perga's Conics). Was this not because celestial motions were taken to be natural motions, unlike those in the terrestrial region (especially in the medieval context, when Aristotle was taken to be the philosopher)? As Kuhn (1957: 245) noted:

In contrast to the average circular motions of classical astronomy, elliptical motions . . . could not be natural motions, for they were not symmetric with respect to any center. A planet moving uniformly on a deferent, or even on a simple epicycle-deferent system, is in some sense "doing the same thing" or "moving in the same way" at each and every point in its orbit; this motion might conceivably be "natural" to it.

In fact, circular motion being preferred for such reasons is potentially a nice example of one of Wray's later claims, in chapter four, that striving for ontological continuity may be a significant bane for scientists.

Wray is also unclear, in this chapter, about what would make a scientist's approach count as instrumentalist. It cannot be that 'the aim of these models [or more accurately the aim of the relevant scientists in creating these models] was to save the phenomena' (13). For a realist scientist -- a scientist, say, who believes the theories they are working with are approximately true and that empirically successful (or well-confirmed) theories are probably approximately true -- might aim to develop such models too. Her attitude towards such models would differ from that of some non-realist scientists. And she would be inclined to do things with said models that some non-realist scientists would not be inclined to do. But charting the precise methodological consequences of different positions in the realism debate requires subtlety. It should also be noted that the methodological implications of scientific realism, say, are quite different from the (social epistemological) consequences of having all scientists be committed scientific realists. For example, the belief that one is discovering facts about fundamental reality -- about unobservable things, underlying the mere appearances -- might have considerable motivational force.

This bring me to my final concern, which is about Wray's stance on the selectionist explanation of the success of science proposed by van Fraassen in The Scientific Image. In developing and defending the selectionist account, Wray complains that the scientific realist has not shown that one should expect approximately true or true theories to be in the selection pool (or to draw an analogy, the population). He writes: 'unless we happen to be choosing between a set of theories that includes the true theory, the mechanism has no means to push us in that direction' (174). Assume this is true. It then seems equally true that unless we happen to be choosing between a set of theories that includes the empirically adequate theory, the mechanism has no means to push us in that direction. Yet Wray does not show why we should expect such a theory to be in the selection pool. Thus this kind of explanation of the success of science doesn't appear to support the notion that achieving empirical adequacy is on the cards. So why would one want to ‘accept’ theories as empirically adequate, as constructive empiricists, with whom Wray aligns himself, think one legitimately can? Naturally, an anti-realist might urge that the probability of selecting an empirically adequate theory at random from the set of all theories is greater than the probability of selecting a true theory at random from the set of all theories. But granting this doesn't help very much. The discussion would have benefitted from the inclusion of some worked examples involving evolutionary theory, such as those appearing in previous work on evolutionary epistemology and the aim of science.

This brings me to my overall assessment. I am not sanguine that the book will 'persuade readers that realists face significant challenges and that anti-realism is a more viable position than commonly thought' (206), unless they happen to have particular pre-existing -- and to my mind, too narrow -- views on what scientific realism and anti-realism are. I do, however, think that the book succeeds in defusing many of the most prominent arguments for scientific realism of a relatively strong (traditional) variety, and in strengthening several of the arguments against scientific realism of that variety. It thereby largely succeeds in resisting that kind of scientific realism -- which still has prominent advocates, such as Psillos -- although it does little to advance any particular view of what we should put in its place. It is essential reading for those interested in the classic arguments in the realism debate. It is also a solid contribution to the anti-realist cause.

The prose flows nicely, and the arguments are typically easy to follow. The book will be accessible to senior undergraduates, although they should be forewarned about the (now) unusual way that phrases like 'theories' and 'theoretical knowledge' are employed therein, and also given an independent overview of the different ways one might characterize scientific realism and anti-realism, in order to get to grips with it.


I'm grateful to Anjan Chakravartty and Peter Vickers for comments on an earlier version of this review.


Kuhn, T. S. 1957. The Copernican Revolution: Planetary Astronomy in the Development of Western Thought. Harvard: Harvard University Press.