Response to Leiter

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Response to Leiter (2002.10.08)

Reviewed by Bruce Wilshire, Rutgers University


(1) It seems to me that one need only read the Leiter report to discover its biases. I believe these biases exercise a constrictive effect on philosophical education in the United States.

(2) I think that most philosophers who can roughly be classified as “analytic” do stem in fact from the phenomenalist tradition initiated by Descartes and developed by the British Empiricists. I think that most such philosophers have been unable to distinguish phenomenalism from phenomenology—a crucial distinction. As Charles Peirce argued, phenomenology (what he termed phaneroscopy), is the first job of philosophy. (One can profitably consult Nicholas Capaldi, The Enlightenment Project in the Analytic Conversation.)

(3) I thank Professor Leiter for his reference to my The Primal Roots of American Philosophy in which I discuss shamanic healing, particularly in connection with William James’s idea of pure experience.