Responsibility and Distributive Justice

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Carl Knight and Zofia Stemplowska (eds.), Responsibility and Distributive Justice, Oxford University Press, 2011, 309pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199565801.

Reviewed by Tamler Sommers, University of Houston


I'm one of the undeserving poor: that's what I am. Think of what that means to a man. . . . If there's anything going and I put in for a bit of it, it's always the same story: "You're undeserving, so you can't have it." But my needs is as great as the most deserving widow's that ever got money out of six different charities in one week for the death of the same husband. I don't need less than a deserving man: I need more. I don't eat less hearty than him; and I drink, well, a lot more.

                                                                           -- Alfred P. Doolittle (from Pygmalian by Bernard Shaw)

John Rawls' famous "difference principle" states that inequalities within a society are only just if they benefit its least advantaged members. But what if this group includes people like Alfred Doolittle who knowingly make choices that result in their "least advantaged" status? The theory known as "luck egalitarianism" -- the focus of most of the essays in this volume -- attempts to address this difficulty by permitting inequalities that are the product of responsible individual choices and behavior.[1] A responsibility-sensitive approach enables luck egalitarians to distinguish Alfred Doolittle from people who are disadvantaged through no fault of their own. This uneven collection of essays examines the virtues and problems of luck egalitarianism and offers a series of perspectives on the relationship between responsibility and distributive justice.

Determining the degree to which people are responsible for their relative status is no simple task. What makes Alfred Doolittle such a magnificent comic creation is how straightforward and reflective he is about his plight. He has thought the matter over carefully and decided to lead the life of a drunken deadbeat. He endorses this decision at every level; his commitment, to borrow Frankfurt's language, resounds through his being. If anyone is responsible for his lot in life, it is Alfred P. Doolittle. In real life, however, people like Doolittle are exceptionally rare if they exist at all. A multitude of complex cultural, social, and biological forces influence our actions and decisions, making it difficult or impossible to identify the choices for which we are responsible. Too often, the literature on distributive justice and responsibility (including some of the work in this volume) fails to adequately address this complexity, and this results in theories that rely on empirically dubious assumptions about human agency.

Susan Hurley's chapter, "The Public Ecology of Responsibility," -- one of two outstanding essays in this collection -- provides compelling support for the worry mentioned above. The target of Hurley's essay is traditional liberalism, in particular its assumption of "the priority of private responsibility," which limits government interference and protects individuals' rights to engage in free and responsible behavior. Hurley argues that research in the cognitive sciences undermines the conception of individual responsibility that grounds traditional liberal principles. Responsibility, on the liberal model, presupposes a capacity for rational agency that is internal to the individual. Research suggests, however, that rational agency "is profoundly embedded in and dependent on the individual's social environment." (192). Consequently, "private responsibility cannot unilaterally provide the limits of public action because individual responsibility isn't private or prior to public action, but has a public ecology to which government action -- or inaction -- inevitably contributes." (192) Hurley presents a wide range of evidence supporting this view of rationality as dependent on processes of ecological attunement. One may quibble with her analysis of a particular study, but it is hard to deny that the research when taken altogether (and there is plenty more that Hurley does not mention) casts serious empirical doubt on the model of classical rationality that is at the heart of traditional liberal principles.

Note that Hurley's challenge applies equally well to most forms of luck egalitarianism, since their proponents employ the same conception of rational agency in order to determine individual responsibility. This is a potentially fatal problem that must be addressed. A worthwhile theory of distributive justice must describe a just system for human beings and not for abstractions that never have existed and never will exist. Unfortunately, most of the authors in this volume, if they acknowledge this worry at all, seem content to sweep it under the rug. Consider, for example, Larry Temkin's discussion of (moral desert for one's character) and its connection to responsibility. Temkin writes:

I believe that the most compelling conception of absolute justice requires the kind of free will that is incompatible with both determinism and indeterminism, and that is notoriously difficult to square with our scientific world view and the obvious way in which both nature and nurture influence our characters. I think we must face this fact head on, and not try to deny it or run from itI am aware, of course, that many will regard my claims here as tantamount to a reductio of the notion of absolute justice. But I do not share this sentiment. Though I don't have the foggiest idea how to solve the mare's nest of (meaningful!) free will, I believe that there is reason to believe, or at least hope, that many rational beings are sufficiently free, in the relevant sense, as to make attributions of responsibility for their characters appropriate. Correspondingly, I suspect the notion of absolute justice is not incoherent -- even if we don't understand how it could be coherent -- and believe that it should be given significant weight in our moral deliberations.[2] (55-56, my emphasis)

This is a truly remarkable passage -- I had to read it over several times to make sure I had read it correctly. Temkin begins by claiming that our notion of absolute justice requires a type of free will that is, at best, very difficult to square with our scientific world view. Indeed, he claims not even to understand how the notion could be coherent. After confessing that doesn't have the foggiest idea how to solve this problem, he nevertheless maintains that there is reason to believe, or at least hope (!), that many of us are free in this sense. Therefore, according to Temkin, absolute justice should still be given significant weight in our moral deliberations, and by extension in our theories of distributive justice. And all of this comes just after the valiant claim that we must face the problem "head on, and not try to run and hide from it"!

Temkin is far from the only philosopher in this debate to blithely ignore the "mare's nest" of freedom and responsibility. This raises troubling methodological and moral concerns about how the debate is conducted. One simply cannot examine the relationship between responsibility and justice without addressing the thorny problems that surround responsibility attribution. All of the impressive and highly technical philosophical machinery, the dizzying array of distinctions, concept clarifications, and counterexamples, amount to very little if the core assumptions of the theories are false. And since these theories have practical import, it is all the more crucial to base them on plausible foundations. If we are to use notions of free will and individual responsibility to justify inequalities, then the notions must be compatible with a scientific understanding of human behavior. Merely asserting -- or hoping -- that the relevant capacities exist is not enough.

With that off my chest, I should say that there is much of value in this collection, and that includes Temkin's essay, which in another section offers a keen analysis of how fairness relates to equality and the egalitarian vision. Richard Arneson's "Luck Egalitarianism -- A Primer" gives a clear presentation of the central issues within that theory, along with intriguing arguments of his own within each section. Norman Daniels applies Rawlsian principles of justice to three social health-care experiments that attempt to provide incentives to individuals to live healthier lives. He argues that these principles better accord with our intuitions than those of the luck egalitarian. Matt Matravers argues that notions of responsibility employed in theories of distributive justice should apply to theories of retributive justice as well. He claims that there is no principled reason to employ different conceptions, as Rawls and others have tried to do. Matravers rejects Samuel Scheffler's view that distributive justice is holistic whereas retributive justice is individualistic, which Scheffler uses to justify the different roles that responsibility should play. The other chapters (save for one discussed below) will be better appreciated by readers who are more convinced than I am of the overarching value of abstract analyses on this topic. One striking feature the chapters share in common is the virtual absence of any discussion about the policy implications of their theories.

I mentioned above that there were two outstanding essays in the volume. Hurley, in her chapter, effectively challenged those theories that employ idealized and empirically inadequate conceptions of individual responsibility. Appropriately, the chapter that follows -- Avner de-Shalit and Jonathan Wolff's "The Apparent Asymmetry of Responsibility" -- is a brilliant example of how to address the connection between responsibility and justice in a way that avoids these difficulties. De-Shalit and Wolff argue in favor of a "weak asymmetry thesis," the view that society should allow people to benefit from choices that turn out well to a greater extent than it allows people to suffer from choices that turn out badly. They describe several ways in which their proposal could be implemented (something that already sets this article apart from most of the others in this volume), and they defend the proposal against both practical and moral objections. Throughout the essay, de-Shalit and Wolff employ a minimalist and entirely uncontroversial understanding of "choice," one that does not require the kind of ultimate responsibility that concerns Temkin. When their argument relies on empirical assumptions, the authors offer suggestive, if not decisive, evidence in their favor. The end result is a convincing, well grounded proposal that could plausibly apply to society as it is presently composed.

De-Shalit and Wolff offer some important methodological insights as well. In a discussion of the now common distinction between "ideal" and "non-ideal" theories of justice, the authors argue for the virtues of the latter. Ideal theories, they write, rely on a "hugely simplified model of the world . . . with known variables, and highly reliable information flows." (219) By contrast, non-ideal theories are designed for real-world conditions, which often require "abandoning our highest aspirations and replacing them with others that have a higher likelihood of successful implementation." (219) A non-ideal theory, according to the authors, will be a theory of balance and compromise. Consequently, if someone wishes to criticize a non-ideal theory, it is not enough to point to a flaw or undesirable consequence. One must show that a better alternative approach is possible under real-world conditions. More generally, the authors insist on the non-ideal approach because "arguments made for or against a theory using an abstract model of the world cannot always be assumed to work as well in the conditions of the real world, where the conditions of the model may not hold." (219) I would add that the problem with ideal theories is not merely one of implementation, but also, as I have emphasized, their dependence on implausible assumptions about human agency.

Let me conclude by saying something nice about the 'ideal theory' approach that characterizes most of the essays in this volume. Responsibility-sensitive policies are prevalent in Western democratic societies. Appeals to individual choice and responsibility are common in political rhetoric concerning health-care, welfare, taxation, and education. As Knight and Stemplowska note in their introduction, a somewhat ironic consequence of the philosophical debate is that it has undermined a number of these policies, and much of the rhetoric, by showing "the many assumptions and countless difficulties involved in attributing responsibility in a way that could justify withholding assistance from those in need." (22). Of course, this result sometimes comes about inadvertently -- philosophers do not always acknowledge these assumptions and difficulties. But the editors are correct that careful philosophical attention to the connection between responsibility and justice -- even when conducted on an abstract level -- has elevated the debate above simple ideology and exposed many of the pitfalls and controversial assumptions required for determining responsibility. With this accomplished, my hope is that the philosophical debate shifts in the "non-ideal" direction, with more focus on theories that apply to the world we live in and to human beings as we really are.

[1] Richard Arneson, in his contribution to this volume, notes that the case of Alfred Doolittle made him question the difference principle and try to elaborate a responsibility-sensitive approach to justice.

[2] Temkin does conclude the paragraph by adding that "there may be many cases where people are not (fully) responsible for their characters, in which cases the notion of absolute justice will not be (fully or straightforwardly) applicable." (56) But of course, this is not the point. Given his remarks a few sentences earlier, it is unclear why he is confident that anyone is, or can be, responsible for their characters in the sense required for absolute justice.