Responsibility for Justice

Placeholder book cover

Iris Marion Young, Responsibility for Justice, Oxford University Press, 2011, 193pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195392388.

Reviewed by Mathias Risse, Harvard University


Iris Marion Young died in August 2006, at the age of only 57. Responsibility for Justice further develops some themes that have been prevalent throughout her life as a scholar, most recently in her book Global Challenges: War, Self-Determination and Responsibility for Justice, which appeared in 2007: structural disadvantage within societies, global interconnectedness, and questions about individual responsibility. Like only very few people in political theory or philosophy, she reflected on these matters as a concerned citizen who also is a teacher and writer. Her effect on my own work comes entirely through an engagement with her writings. Over the years I have time and again found myself in need of an apt way of capturing an underdog's particular predicament or a neglected group's specific complaint. And time and again I have found that Iris Young could supply just the right words, subtle enough to capture the pain involved and general enough to make clear why these matters required theorizing. I will continue to consult her work.[1]

Responsibility for Justice was left unfinished. It is published with a preface written by her husband, David Alexander, and a foreword by Martha Nussbaum. Young's husband writes that, except for minor editorial changes, the published text is as she left it on her computer in 2005, when she was last able to work on the book. But this cannot be quite right. In chapter 1, when Young discusses the lack of responsible actions on the side of the privileged, we read that "speculation in mortgage-backed securities … that led to financial collapse beginning in 2008 is just the most recent and wide-ranging example of systematic privileged irresponsibility harming millions of people" (p. 25). To be sure: the truly abysmal behavior of some of society's most advantaged that precipitated that financial collapse evinces what she discusses in that chapter. But 2008 was two years after she died. The reader is therefore left without a clear sense of how much editorial work has in fact been done on this book. I will not discuss every chapter and every theme in this work. I will focus on the particular insights into questions of political philosophy that are generated by the perspective from which Young normally writes, the perspective of a citizen-theorist. In one important case she is led to an erroneous judgment I think precisely because she writes from that perspective. But in other cases, this perspective is distinctly illuminating.

The first chapter, "From Personal to Political Responsibility," is stage-setting and (also being the longest chapter in the book) captures very well her citizen-theorist approach to political theory. As many will remember, the 1996 Personal Responsibility and Work Opportunity Reconciliation Act (signed into law by Bill Clinton, after his rebuffing previous attempts at welfare-reform by the Republicans) did indeed "end welfare as we know it," or had known it until then. Roosevelt's New Deal and Johnson's Great Society had expanded state services in the United States. In 1996, it seemed to a lot of people (and not just to Republicans) that too many of the welfare programs that had been tried over the decades had not passed the test of time: they had not succeeded in making poverty history. The 1996 Act removed the actual entitlement to welfare, limited the amount of time during which citizens can receive it, generally required working at a job or involvement in a "work activity" as a prerequisite for receiving welfare, and took highly punitive measures against those who violated its conditions. Related changes have also occurred in European states, though they were less punitive, and often less far-reaching. As Young reports, the intellectual struggle for these reforms was driven by an emphasis on ideas of personal responsibility, understood as self-sufficiency (more particularly self-sufficiency of persons living together as families). As far as Young is concerned, ending welfare as we had known it meant to ignore basic realities about our contemporary, rather complex, societies: that we live within highly interdependent structures that often affect people in unpredictable ways.

Influential voices pushing for reforms of this sort included Lawrence Mead and Charles Murray. Mead's 1986 book, Beyond Entitlement: The Social Obligations of Citizenship, and Murray's 1984 book, Losing Ground, American Social Policy 1950-1980, sought to offer much substantial evidence for the view that welfare programs had failed. They both championed personal responsibility understood as self-sufficiency (rejecting the view that "the system" was to blame). For those of us who were not engaged with these matters in the previous century it may seem odd that Young would turn to these authors. But she thought that, while the evidence they presented had been sufficiently well assessed, a normative assessment was still missing. And in any event, the political and intellectual struggle about what social services the government should provide is ongoing and is not likely to be settled soon. Young criticizes three assumptions that she argues Mead and Murray make: (a) Personal responsibility and social structural causation of social status are mutually exclusive: it is either the one or the other; (b) the background conditions against which people act today are not unjust, so that the welfare state is not morally required; (c) policy makers and citizens need only worry about the lack of responsibility of the needy poor; for the most part other people act responsibly. Having rebutted these three assumptions she advocates for a return to understanding poverty and disadvantage in structural terms: "it's the system after all."

I will not quarrel with any of her rebuttals. The negations of (a), (b), and (c) strike me as trivially true. The recent and ongoing financial crisis indeed has powerfully illustrated claim (c). So perhaps an editor of the book could not help but make this explicit in Young's own text (see above). However, one must wonder then whether the debate about Mead and Murray's work can depend much on these claims. And I am afraid it does not. As Young is aware, much of that debate was, and continues to be, about empirical matters, questions about the origins of social problems and about how effectively to remedy them. Why do people fall into and remain in poverty? How do people become criminals, and who is most susceptible to the allure of crime? Why do so many people end up in single-parent households? What effect does the availability or unavailability of welfare have on decisions of men and women to have children, try to get more education, or on their ability or willingness to find and keep jobs? What impact does education have on prospects of advancement? How should one characterize, and modify, factors other than education that lead to social advancement, and what is their relative importance vis-à-vis education?

Sensible welfare measures would have to be informed by some basic sense of what the answers to these questions are -- and these are not philosophical questions. One might well agree with Young that the strong emphasis on personal responsibility is misguided and that indeed the life prospects of individuals are shaped by large-scale social processes. One might well agree that the dichotomy stated in (a) is false, that background conditions are not just, and that irresponsible action is endemic to all circles. One might correspondingly take issue with the basic point of the 1996 Act: that welfare is not a matter of citizen entitlement. Nonetheless, we find millions of people who -- under the present conditions and the conditions that held in the 90s (conditions that include education, perspectives of life, accessible infrastructure, available welfare provisions, etc.) -- are unable to move out of poverty. And to change that status quo, we need social welfare programs that actually do the job and need to be evaluated for their effectiveness. There is, of course, also a normative dimension to social policy. But the crucial normative question in this domain is: precisely what, and how much, does justice require? And here, presumably, Young would differ considerably from Murray and Mead. So in short, I believe Young is right here, and Murray and Mead should sensibly have little to disagree with her about claims (a), (b), and (c). But at the same time, conceding this particular point settles very little that matters about social policy. We would then barely be at the beginning of the conversation with Mead and Murray (or improved versions of their theory).

Young's chapter then takes an interesting turn. Much like the conservatives, Young says, liberal philosophers too have contributed to the rhetoric of personal responsibility at the expense of focusing on how large-scale social processes can be improved. Liberal philosophers, that is, have contributed to an erosion of the insight that individual life prospects are shaped by the social structures in which they find themselves and therefore have ultimately contributed to a climate in which the more privileged refuse to assume responsibility for generating social structures that help the poor. More specifically, Young's target is the luck-egalitarians, a group of thinkers that includes Ronald Dworkin, G.A. Cohen, Richard Arneson, John Roemer, and others, who have offered views of justice that combine egalitarian commitments of sorts with an emphasis on individual responsibility. (A better name for them, following a suggestion by Arneson, would be "responsibility-catering egalitarians.") Luck-egalitarians, according to Young, are importantly similar to those who actually made personal responsibility central to policy-discourse.

Take the work of Ronald Dworkin. Dworkin seeks to develop a political ideal around the idea of equal concern for each person. People should be compensated for effects on their lives that are beyond their control, but not for effects of their choices. The distribution of resources, says Dworkin, should be endowment-insensitive and ambition-sensitive, where "endowment" includes both social and genetic factors. Problematic according to Young is that Dworkin conceptualizes everything that is not derived from a person's choices in terms of luck and thus does not single out those matters that are due to social processes. Thereby he blocks the way for asking how one's choices bear on the circumstances of others. Dworkin does and must assume that there is a background social structure, but does not much theorize it -- and to the extent that he does, Dworkin is concerned with compensating people after the fact, rather than with creating social structures that generate less of a need for such compensation in the first place.

If true, Young's attack on luck-egalitarians is quite powerful. It reminds me of an article that the late Tony Judt published in the London Review of Books in 2006 and that has been included in his collection Reappraisals: Reflections on the Forgotten Twentieth Century (Penguin, 2008). In "The Silence of the Lambs: On the Strange Death of Liberal America," Judt argues that

in domestic politics liberals once believed in the provision of welfare, good government, and social justice. In foreign affairs they had a long-standing commitment to international law, negotiations, and importance of moral example. Today a spreading me-first consensus has replaced vigorous debate in both arenas. (p. 385)

Judt's own concern in that article is with foreign policy. Liberal writers on foreign policy deviated ever more from the tenets that they traditionally held, Judt says, accepting a vision of world politics guided by a perception of a clash of cultures. Thereby they helped set the stage for George W. Bush's aggressive foreign policy. Using a term employed by Lenin, Judt argues that these liberal writers became Bush's "useful idiots." Essentially, Young argues that other liberal writers have developed their theory now in such a way that domestically too liberal writers played into the hands of highly non-liberal policy-makers. Read side by side, Young's and Judt's pieces deliver a crushing indictment of the recent policy impact of liberal thinking (or in any event, of the intellectual resources they provide to resist non-liberal policies).

I'd say, though, that Dworkin is not guilty as charged, and neither is luck-egalitarianism as a whole. The crucial issue is if Dworkin's theory prevents us from properly theorizing our responsibility for the way in which background conditions are created under which individuals flourish or fail. I do not think it does. It is true that Dworkin's approach renders central a distinction between choice and circumstances. But these circumstances include social background conditions against whose negative impact individuals need to be protected. And recall that the guiding idea is, after all, to conceptualize a society in which each individual is treated with equal concern. Dworkin is often preoccupied with making sure that no stratified society arises. He theorizes relevant measures in terms of hypothetical insurance policies that individuals would have taken out under certain circumstances. But the proper use of this device in the ex post scenario is not that we have to wait until people find themselves in dire straits and then pay them compensation while measures that would generate more propitious social structures are not on offer. On the contrary: ongoing, strong redistributive measures are justified to build a society that indeed expresses equal concern for each individual. This is clear especially from Dworkin's discussion in various pieces included in Sovereign Virtue (Harvard University Press, 2002), especially Chapter 9, on "Justice, Insurance, and Luck," and Chapters 11 and 12, on affirmative action.

What is curious is that Young explores Dworkin's theory in some detail, and in a very thoughtful way. In fact, she does so in terms of that one chapter from Sovereign Virtue that I think offers the strongest evidence against her take on Dworkin, "Justice, Insurance, and Luck." I am genuinely puzzled why she would think that his theory blocks the realization that individuals have a responsibility for background structures in society. I suspect the explanation is that Young and Dworkin approach political theory from rather different vantage points and that Young takes Dworkin to task for not emphasizing certain themes as much as she herself would, although these themes do readily find a place in Dworkin's theory. Young thinks about political theory as a citizen-theorist concerned with the underdog; she herself strongly emphasizes, and apparently prefers that others strongly emphasize, how a responsible citizen should think about her role in politics and how she can improve the lot of the disadvantaged. Dworkin is concerned to develop a foundational theory and connect it to applications without imagining himself as speaking to the citizen-activist in quite this direct way. He writes in a way that makes his theory most immediately useful for a Supreme Court justice, a senator, or an academic, rather than a responsible citizen. One would have to push Dworkin's theory to see what it implies for such a citizen. Nonetheless Young is misguided in characterizing Dworkin and other luck-egalitarians as offering theories that in the ways that matter most are quite similar to what she finds in Mead and Murray. Mead and Murray push for a rhetoric of plainly excessive self-sufficiency. Luck-egalitarians seek to combine basic egalitarian ideas about how our fates are tied with plausible ideas about personal responsibility. These are very different things. And one can indeed resort to responsibility-catering egalitarianism to rebut the rhetoric of excessive self-sufficiency, by providing a much more sensible way of accommodating what is morally valuable and politically significant about personal responsibility.

If I am right, Young comes to a needlessly harsh, and in fact misguided, judgment about Dworkin and other luck-egalitarians because she gets carried away by her own perspective as a citizen-theorist. (If I am wrong, we are still left with the finding that Young takes Dworkin to task for something he is not guilty of, so I'm offering this bit of explanatory speculation in a friendly spirit.) In other parts of her book, however, it is precisely from this perspective that she makes very helpful contributions. Much like Dworkin, Rawls has not written primarily with the citizen-activist in mind. Unlike Dworkin, Rawls has done fairly little even to apply his theory to concrete questions. There is, however, an interesting connection between how Rawls conceptualizes responsibility and how Young does. I believe that the two are usefully complimentary. To show this, we can draw on the discussions in Young's chapters 2 and 4. In chapter 2, Young is eager to distinguish herself from Rawls. Young's talk about social structures and large-scale social processes that shape individuals' lives and in light of which talk about personal responsibility must be highly qualified will remind many readers of Rawls's talk about the basic structure as the subject of justice. And in fact, in chapter 2 Young makes clear that her argument "broadly endorses the intuition behind John Rawls's claim that structure is the subject of justice" (p. 64). However, Rawls, she insists, "thinks about structure in the wrong way" (p. 70). For Rawls the basic structure is, as she says, a part of the overall structure of social interactions -- the part to which principles of justice apply. In line with a fair amount of recent criticism of Rawls Young finds this misguided. All interactions among individuals in society are subject to considerations of justice. Young talks about "structures" not in order to set certain institutions or practices aside as the subject of justice, but in order to formulate a particular way of talking about social interactions, namely, to talk about them from the standpoint of what distribution of advantage they generate.

I must confess that I cannot get really clear on how precisely she thinks about the differences between Rawls and herself here. Rawls has a particular way of capturing the advantages whose regulation is the subject of social justice, namely, in terms of primary goods. The basic structure includes those institutions that generate the distribution of primary goods. What is regulated by principles of justice then is the distribution of those goods that concern individuals as citizens. The kind of regulation required by Rawls' principles of justice is quite demanding, including, as it does, an insistence on fair equality of opportunity vis-à-vis the acquisition of primary goods and the difference principle (and thus an assurance that there is no available set of reforms that would create a society in which the least well-off group is better off than the least well-off group under the present arrangements). I fail to see which of her concerns could not be covered in Rawls' way of dealing with the basic structure. The example she keeps using throughout is housing. Young draws attention to the possibility that a concatenation of respectively quite inoffensive decisions by lots of agents might create a situation where some people find themselves without feasible housing options. Rawls does not discuss housing, nor does his theory offer a guarantee that nobody falls through the cracks. But between them the fair equality of opportunity principle and the difference principle can in principle be utilized to assess patterns of available housing. ("In principle:" there is no guarantee in Rawls' theory that a society guided by his principles would not allow for a set of decisions that would be otherwise impeccable but nonetheless make it hard for some people to find adequate housing.)

My sense that Rawls and Young have a lot in common here is reinforced by their respective treatment of responsibility, and it is here where I think that her perspective as a citizen-theorist makes a useful contribution. Readers may recall that an extended discussion of responsibility is notoriously absent from Rawls' Theory of Justice and is never prominent on his agenda. Yet Rawls does offer the following account in several subsequent essays (emphasis added):

This conception [of justice] includes what we may call a social division of responsibility: society, the citizens as a collective body, accepts the responsibility for maintaining the equal basic liberties and fair equality of opportunity, and for providing a fair share of the other primary goods for everyone within this framework, while citizens (as individuals) and associations accept the responsibility for revising and adjusting their ends and aspirations in view of the all-purpose means they can expect, given their present and foreseeable situation.[2]

A fair system of social cooperation as envisaged by Rawls can exist over time only if the possession of certain goods is regulated such that the fairness of the interaction and the participants' freedom and equality persists over time. Moreover, such a system can persist only if citizens as a collective body assume responsibility for organizing the basic structure so as to support such a system of cooperation. Otherwise, the aggregative effect of individual decisions (on markets, say) may over time undermine the status of some as free and equal citizens. In addition, cooperation remains fair and individuals free and equal only if they do not unreasonably burden each other with the costs of their decisions. Variations in preferences and tastes

are seen as our own responsibility… . that we can take responsibility for our ends is part of what free citizens may expect of one another. Taking responsibility for our tastes and preferences, whether or not they have arisen from our actual choices, is a special case of that responsibility. As citizens with realized moral powers, this is something we must learn to deal with. (Rawls, Political Liberalism, p. 185)

Individuals must take responsibility for tastes and preferences regardless of whether they have actually chosen to have them. The notion of responsibility that enters here does not gain respectability by being useful for an account of the free-will problem. It is not reducible to notions of responsibility current in that context, such as responsibility drawing on either causal involvement or voluntary choice. This notion cannot play such roles, as much as those conceptions are unsuitable to ensure that burdens are distributed in a manner that guarantees the continuation of fair cooperation among free and equal citizens. Rawls' notion o of responsibility is thoroughly political, fitting only for the relationship of shared citizenship.

Again, Rawls says strikingly little about responsibility. But we can tell that the notion of individual responsibility that enters here is not one of liability, as Young puts the point in her chapter 4. Young is concerned there to assess what kind of responsibility individuals have for the maintenance of social background structures. What we read in Rawls and what we read in Young merge in a rather sensible way. While Rawls tells us a bit about how to think about the individuals' responsibility for their own tastes within a pattern of a social division of responsibility, he does not address how we should think about their responsibility for the maintenance of a fair background structure. After all, when Rawls talks about a social division of responsibility we must ultimately find the same individuals on both sides: citizens must assume responsibility for their preferences and tastes to some extent, but those same people must also make sure that a fair background structure is being maintained. The "social connection model" that Young introduces in chapter 4 fits that bill neatly. Here too we are dealing with political responsibility -- a notion that does not turn on ideas of personal liability or guilt. Many individual actions together create a certain distribution of advantages. They constitute social practices within which certain roles emerge, some of them powerful and others dismally wanting. Young writes,

My responsibility is essentially shared with others because the harms are produced by many of us acting together within accepted institutions and practices, and because it is not possible for any of us to identify just what in our own actions results in which aspect of the injustice that particular individuals suffer. (p. 110)

As already alluded to, Young's example in chapters 2 and 4 is homelessness, more specifically, in a concrete example, the plight of a single mother named Sandy who must find a new place to live because she is evicted from her home after the landlord sells the building to a developer. Sandy encounters some discrimination in the search because she is a single mother, but even more importantly, she has a hard time finding an affordable vacancy in an area from where it is feasible to reach the part of town where she works (which is the part of town where jobs for people with her skill set and constraints are most readily found). Young continues,

Discharging my responsibility in relation to the structural injustice of homelessness might involve, then, my trying to persuade others that this threat to well-being is a matter of injustice rather than misfortune and that we participate together in the processes that cause it. We then would enjoin one another to work on our collective relationships and try to transform the necessary practices. (p. 112)

This is an apt way of developing the Rawlsian idea of a social division of responsibility and, more specifically, of developing in a concrete way what it means that "society as a whole" has a responsibility for maintaining fair background conditions. At the end of the day, again, it is individual citizens who must come together to attend to these tasks. Let me be clear: my point is not the rather disrespectful one that "what's right in Young is already in Rawls." My point is that Young, the citizen-theorist, approaches the theme of shared responsibility for the background structure from the standpoint of what this means for individual citizens. That is a standpoint that is not taken by many of the more influential political theorists of our age. Earlier I complained that Young sometimes gets carried away by thinking from this standpoint. But here we can see how thinking from that standpoint is fruitful and illuminating.

Let me address one last topic. Young's chapter 5 discusses responsibility across borders. Her view here is nicely integrated into the contemporary debate about global justice. She finds it rather implausible that obligations of justice would apply respectively only within countries. At the same time, she also shies away from what she calls the "cosmopolitan-utilitarian" view that denies any basic normative importance to states. Young does not offer a systematic alternative to the state-focused view on the applicability of obligations of justice and its cosmopolitan-utilitarian competitor. She does, however, approach this subject too from the standpoint of what the responsible citizen should do, for instance, when it comes to economic entanglements that cross borders. "Social justice" is a term that she does not limit to what happens inside of a given country; social justice at the global level, as she puts it, is concerned with social processes that connect people in different parts of the world. Such social processes include legal and regulatory institutions (such as the WTO or international courts), as well as business practices, media, and leisure and consumption tastes of ordinary people. For instance, retailers and consumers are connected to producers, and those connections trigger obligations of justice. Young's most extensively discussed example here are sweatshops.

One might wonder now whether the individual is not hopelessly overburdened with responsibility for social processes at the global level. Young addresses the concern, explaining that there is a certain degree of discretion and openness involved here: responsible citizens need to decide how much they can do. Nonetheless, they may well be criticized for not doing enough, or for doing something that is counterproductive, or ineffective. What can be asked of people, or of institutions, depends on how much power they have with regard to the problem at stake; on how privileged they are and thus how easy it is for them to take some action and change their current habits; on what their "collective ability" is to bring about change, that is, their ability to mobilize resistance; but also on their own interests -- victims themselves, on Young's non-liability-based understanding of responsibility, have a responsibility to precipitate change. The prospects for change for the better, Young concedes, are always slim, so what ought the responsible citizen to do? She tells us,

Social change requires first taking special efforts to make a break in the process, by engaging in public discussions that reflect on their workings, publicizing the harms that come to persons who are disadvantaged by them, and criticizing powerful agents who encourage the injustices or at least allow them to happen. (p. 150)

States and international organizations by themselves cannot be trusted to do these things: in fact, they are most likely to do them if they represent responsible citizens who insist on them. These citizens, in turn, must offer -- and these are the concluding words of chapter 5 -- "vocal criticism, organized contestation, a measure of indignation, and concerted public pressure" (p. 151).

Her rejection of the two aforementioned approaches to global justice is quite plausible, and it seems increasingly more people in the profession agree with it. (I myself certainly do, and my own work in recent years has gone towards developing a sensible alternative in a constructive manner.) A major challenge, then, is to provide a plausible theory of justice at the global level that replaces both of these. Young does not attempt to do so in a systematic way. But as before, she applies her perspective as a citizen-theorist and thinks through what a plausible theory of global justice (yet to be provided) would ask of a responsible citizen. Perhaps the reason why I find it rather easy to agree with all this is because little is said about substantive matters. Elsewhere Young has made more detailed contributions to questions of fairness in trade, which does create more space for disagreement. But since she does not do so here, her discussion of this topic provides a welcome opportunity to end this review simply with a note of gratitude. The concerned citizen is indeed an addressee who is often neglected by those who make a living out of writing about normative matters. Political philosophers and theorists offer responsible citizens fairly little direct guidance for the "vocal criticism, organized contestation, measure of indignation, and concerted public pressure" that are so clearly desirable. Young is among the very few who have offered such guidance to citizens in relatively concrete terms. Thus she has rendered both the philosophers/theorists and the concerned citizens a great service. And for that: "Thank you."

[1] I am grateful to Gabriel Wollner for helpful comments on this piece.

[2] "Social Unity and Primary Goods," p. 371; see also "Fairness to Goodness," p. 284, "Reply to Alexander and Musgrave," (1999a), p. 241, "A Kantian Conception of Equality," p. 261; "Justice as Fairness: Political Not Metaphysical," p. 407. References are to Rawls, Collected Papers. Ed. S. Freeman (Harvard University Press, 1999).