Responsibility from the Margins

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David Shoemaker, Responsibility from the Margins, Oxford University Press, 2015, 262pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198715672.

Reviewed by Matthew Talbert, West Virginia University


Like a great deal of contemporary work on moral responsibility, David Shoemaker's impressive new book owes a debt to the approach pioneered by P. F. Strawson in his 1963 essay, "Freedom and Resentment." Indeed, Shoemaker describes his book as an "attempt to develop as fully as possible a Strawsonian theory of responsibility" (vii). Shoemaker is, however, no orthodox Strawsonian, and his reservations about the dominant elaborations of that perspective provide the framework for developing a distinctive and meticulously defended theory of moral responsibility. Shoemaker's approach will certainly influence how debates about moral responsibility unfold in the coming years.

Part of Strawson's lasting contribution is to have drawn attention to the degree to which our responsibility practices are structured by an interest in the good or ill will that we express toward one another through our actions. Shoemaker understands the appeal of approaches that emphasize quality of will, but he is also sensitive to the hazards of taking this route. For one thing, on Strawson's picture, an agent's quality of will appears to be "the sole object of our appropriate responsibility responses" and "the sole unifying explanation of nonresponsibility" (7). Shoemaker argues that this position is open to a serious objection because some agents who are capable of expressing good or ill will through their behavior do not seem to be open to the full range of responses that characterize our responsibility practices.

Many of the cases that don't fit comfortably with the quality of will approach involve instances of what Shoemaker calls marginal agency. These are "cases at the boundaries of our interpersonal community where agents tend to strike us as eligible for some responsibility responses but not others" (4). Among other possibilities, the agents in these cases may be at the high-functioning end of the autism spectrum, they may be psychopaths, they may suffer from dementia or depression, or they may have mild intellectual disabilities. Shoemaker treats all these cases with sophistication, care, and due attention to the relevant empirical literature.

On Shoemaker's analysis, a central defect of most Strawsonian approaches is that they rely on a monistic, one-size-fits-all conception of "quality of will." This explains the difficulty these approaches have accommodating our ambivalent responses in marginal cases. What's needed, Shoemaker argues, is a pluralistic understanding of quality of will (or, more precisely, of what "will" comes to in this context), one that recognizes that our responsibility practices have multiple objects. Shoemaker settles on three such objects, three "agential features" that have particular significance for us: we care about "what kinds of agents people are, the judgments they make, and the regard they have for us. That is to say, we care about their general character, about how and what they judge worthy in particular cases, and about how they view us" (24).

Thus, Shoemaker replaces competing monistic conceptions of quality of will with a tripartite conception: our responsibility practices track and assess "will" in the guise of quality of character, quality of judgment, and quality of regard. Responding to the good or bad quality of each type of will are three pairs of sentiments (as on sentimental theories of value, Shoemaker's sentiments are pan-cultural emotion syndromes marked by their stability in the face of contrary judgments (19-24)). Each responsive sentiment pair defines the range of a type of moral responsibility: attributability (where responsibility assessments evaluate character), answerability (which evaluates judgment), and accountability (which evaluates regard). The solution to the problem of marginal agents is, then, to recognize that a given agent may possess one form of quality of will but not another, and so may be responsible in one sense but not in another, and may therefore be open to some responses, but not to others.

The first half of Shoemaker's book describes the three forms of responsibility just mentioned; the second half applies the tripartite theory to specific marginal cases. I'll focus below on laying out the structure of the tripartite theory, giving some attention to how marginal cases fit into this scheme. Unfortunately, there are many topics Shoemaker discusses that I won't be able to consider here. I will note, though, that he takes on several subjects -- e.g., the status of intellectually disabled agents and of those who exhibit obsessive moral scrupulosity -- that are not much discussed by responsibility theorists. Moreover, Shoemaker's accounts of these agents -- as well, for example, as his detailed treatment of empathy -- have implications beyond responsibility theory and should be of interest to a broad set of moral psychologists.

An attributable agent -- one who is morally responsible in the attributability sense -- is open to responses "organized around the paradigm sentimental syndrome pair of agential admiration/disdain" on account of the quality of her character (59). These responses include esteem, awe, and veneration on the positive side and contempt, abhorrence, and hatred on the negative side (39). The quality of an agent's character is a function of the quality of her evaluative commitments and of her non-evaluative cares. Shoemaker argues that both of these features of our selves disclose something salient for the purposes of moral evaluation (47-56). However, some readers will no doubt be wary of attributing cares to agents as a basis for moral assessment if these cares are cut off from the agent's evaluative judgments (and some may find that evaluative judgments can be discerned even in the cases that Shoemaker describes as evaluation-free).

Some actors -- e.g., animals or very young children -- may lack characters in the relevant sense and will not be appropriate targets for assessment in terms of admiration or disdain. Other agents may possess characters but not be open to attributability responses in particular instances because their behavior was merely compulsive and not indicative of their cares and commitments; on the other hand, some compulsive disorders, such as scrupulosity, feature ego-syntonic obsessions that do not rule out attributability (137-143). Importantly, attributable agents need not possess normative competence (61). This means that psychopaths, for example, may be appropriate objects of disdain or admiration on account of the quality of their character even though their ability to recognize the force of moral considerations is significantly impaired.

An answerable agent is open to responses associated with the sentiments of pride and regret on account of the quality of her judgments (82). These responses include approval and appreciation in positive cases and disapproval, irritation, and shame in negative cases (65).

In a sense, quality of judgment is also relevant to attributability since the quality of an agent's character will often depend on the evaluative stances she takes. However, for Shoemaker, "quality of judgment" refers to something more specific. It requires not just that an agent has guided her behavior on the basis of judgments about reasons, it also "requires access to, and judgment among, a contrast class of reasons relative to which one's judgment may be better or worse" (75). Thus, the answerable agent can reasonably be asked not just for the considerations that she judged to count in favor of F-ing but also, "'Why did you F instead of not-F?'" (75).

Quality of judgment therefore requires a degree of normative competence. Shoemaker argues that one cannot make relative judgments about the worth of F-ing as compared to not F-ing -- cannot be said to choose the one over the other -- unless one is capable of seeing as reasons the facts that count in favor of not F-ing (75-76). This capacity, and the counterfactual possibilities it opens up, makes regret intelligible. Regret "views longingly the road not taken" (75) and wishes that things were otherwise, but this makes sense only for the normatively competent agent who might have taken the other path. The agent who cannot feel this sort of regret -- e.g., the psychopath (except in an attenuated sense; see 178-79) -- is not a proper target for the third-personal responses that fall under the pride/regret paradigm.

This can lead to results that initially seem odd. For example, to the degree that psychopaths "have serious deficits in seeing facts about others' normative perspectives as 'reasonish,'" they are not open to answerability disapproval even when they "judge that others' interests are not reason-giving" (189). On the other hand, psychopaths are open to "[attributability] disdain for their cruelty" (189). But surely, for most of us, when we attribute cruelty to someone, we disapprove of them and we do so partly on account of their dispositions to form certain kinds of judgments. I suspect that, up to a point, Shoemaker will have little interest in debating this issue since he notes in several places that he is not an "emotion-term chauvinist" (40, 68, 70, 90). I take this to signal Shoemaker's lack of interest in policing emotion terms. Perhaps it's fine for someone to say she "disapproves" of psychopaths, but Shoemaker is focusing on the negative emotions -- by whatever name -- that are particularly aroused by the judgments of normatively competent agents.

Shoemaker's focus is, of course, a worthy one. But we might still wonder whether there are negative emotional responses that are made fitting by the cruelty of normatively incompetent agents and that go beyond the emotions that Shoemaker associates with mere attributability. I'll make a related proposal in my closing paragraphs.

An agent is accountable if he is liable, in virtue of his quality of regard, to a set of responses grouped around the sentiments of anger and gratitude (113). These responses include resentment, indignation, and guilt on the one hand and gratification and warm feelings on the other (35). As with quality of judgment, Shoemaker has something fairly narrow in mind when he invokes "quality of regard." It requires not just the ability to take a perspective on other agents but also a capacity for empathy: a capacity for "coming to see facts about others' . . . normative perspectives as putative reasons" or for "coming to feel what others feel in a simpatico fashion" (113).

The characteristic response to poor quality of regard -- a specific type of anger -- also requires a form of empathy on the part of its target. Anger responds to "slights" and "it has a confrontational, communicative component built in to its action tendency" (112). (Shoemaker speaks of "slights" rather than "wrongs" because he takes anger to be an apt response to objectionable behaviors that are not wrongs (94-96)). What anger "aims to communicate is a demand for acknowledgment, a demand that the slighter take up the slighted's normative perspective"; thus, for anger "to serve as a form of intelligible communication," its target "must be capable of understanding the demand being communicated and be able to accede to it" (112).

Shoemaker argues that agents can be fitting targets of anger, and so be accountable, even for behavior that is not attributable to them: one may act on a whim that reveals a lack of regard but nothing about one's character (113; see 83 for a similar point about answerability). An agent may also be answerable (because she can make comparative value judgments) without being accountable (because she is impaired for feeling empathy). Shoemaker suggests that this may be the case with agents at the high-functioning end of the autism spectrum (166-72). There are even agents who are accountable but not answerable on Shoemaker's account. This is the case with some who suffer mild intellectual disabilities (MID):

while it may be less than fitting to disapprove of or criticize an adult with MID for poor moral judgment [because of her impairment in that domain], the demand that she 'feel what she has done' may be fully fitting, precisely because it is a concrete appeal unreliant on judgment, and one she seems fully capable of undertaking. (186)

I'll conclude with some reservations about the role that communication and empathy play in Shoemaker's approach to accountability -- related considerations apply to the normative competence component of answerability. We've seen that Shoemaker takes a communicative tendency to be built into the type of anger associated with accountability; he calls this "agential anger." This rules out holding psychopaths accountable because, given their empathy impairments, there is "no communicative point to blaming them," so agential anger is inapt in their case (105, see also 162 and 202). Of course, this point holds only insofar as we're considering a form of anger that essentially aims at moral communication, but I suspect that we can make sense of a form of anger -- or perhaps an aspect of anger -- that lacks this component. For example, there might be an anger-like emotion that is aroused merely by awareness that another intelligent being has treated us with unjustifiable cruelty, and independently of whether that being is a candidate for moral conversation. Insofar as this sort of anger responds to a moral failing, it should, I think, be counted as an expression of moral blame.

It's worth emphasizing in this context that Shoemaker sets a high standard for agential anger and its communicative aim. We can, after all, communicate our anger to the psychopath in the sense of making him aware of it. But since the psychopath is not an apt target of agential anger, that emotion's communicative effort must aim at something more: it aims at "making the slighter fully aware of what he has done. It is a demand to get him to appreciate, to acknowledge, the emotional havoc (and worse) that he has wreaked" (107).

This asks a lot of anger and many instances fall short. This is particularly evident when we consider a different sort of marginal case: namely, wrongdoers who are deeply committed to odious moral outlooks -- the devoted Mafioso, torturer, slave-owner, and so on. In these cases, we can expect that our moral anger will have little communicative effect, but it does not therefore seem inapt. How do we explain this? Here Shoemaker might refer to the "dormant capacity" (202) for empathy that even a hardened (but non-psychopathic) Mafioso might retain. Perhaps this capacity -- and the hope for effective moral communication that it represents -- explains why angry blame is apt in the Mafioso's case but not in the psychopath's.

Yet in some of these cases involving hardened wrongdoers, the one who blames must recognize that the prospects for fruitful moral conversation are exceedingly dim. And if it is expected that such conversation will not occur, then perhaps the sort of anger featured in these cases does not essentially aim at it. A related consideration applies to the angry, blaming emotions we can feel toward the dead: they might have been capable of recognizing the wrong for which we blame them when they committed it, but no such recognition is in the offing after their death.

I take these points to suggest that there is an aspect to the moralized anger involved in blame -- or that there is a type of anger involved in blame -- that doesn't depend on achieving successful communication with wrongdoers. We're not in the realm of Shoemaker's accountability at this point, but the anger to which I've been gesturing nonetheless seems to me an important and recognizable element of our blaming practices.


I'd like to thank Shoemaker for discussing aspects of his view with me.