Responsible Belief: A Theory in Ethics and Epistemology

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Rik Peels, Responsible Belief: A Theory in Ethics and Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2017, 288 pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190608118.

Reviewed by Gunnar Björnsson, Stockholm University


Rik Peels provides a comprehensive, original account of intellectual duties, doxastic blameworthiness, and responsible belief. The discussions, relating to work in epistemology as well as moral responsibility, are clear and often provide useful entries into the literature. Though I disagree with some of the main conclusions, the arguments are carefully laid out and typically merit a good amount of thought, even where one remains unconvinced. After providing an overview of the contents, I will specifically suggest that Peels' theory fails to account for one important kind of doxastic obligation and doxastic blame.

In Chapter 1, Peels defends his understanding of the phenomena that are central to his inquiry. In line with a broadly Strawsonian tradition, he understands being responsible for believing something as meriting a class of positive, negative, or neutral "normative" (responsibility-imputing) attitudes for that belief, attitudes that include, prominently, praise and blame. Believing that p is understood as either occurrently, dormantly, or tacitly thinking that p, and believing responsibly as being the proper object of positive or neutral normative attitudes for one's belief.

Chapter 2 takes on the problem that we might seem to lack the sort of control over our beliefs that is required for responsibility. Following William Alston, Peels argues that blameworthy belief and responsible belief cannot be understood in terms of failure or success in living up to obligations to believe certain things. First, since we do not directly voluntarily control whether we believe that p, we cannot have obligations to directly believe that p. Second, although we can indirectly control whether we believe that p by making it true that p or by manipulating the evidence that we encounter, this sort of control does not plausibly ground doxastic obligations and responsibility. Moreover, some intentional control is needed, Peels argues. It is not enough that belief formation is reasons-responsive and endorsed by the agent: the agent must be able to intentionally influence what she believes in order to be responsible for it.

In Chapter 3, Peels defends the idea that doxastic responsibility is to be understood in terms of our capacity and corresponding intellectual obligations to influence our beliefs through voluntary control over doxastic mechanisms, cognitive situatedness, and intellectual virtue. (An obligation is intellectual if failure to discharge it would result in belief that is somehow bad -- epistemically, morally, or prudentially.) Very roughly, the suggestion is that one responsibly believes that p if and only if one had control over such belief-influencing factors pertaining to one's belief that p and either one did not violate any intellectual obligations in coming to believe that p, or one is excused for doing so.

Chapter 4 offers the first part of Peels' account of doxastic excuses and makes the case that responsible belief entails the ability to believe otherwise. According to Peels, a variety of excuses (collected under the umbrella term "force") undermine blameworthiness for believing that p by making it the case that the agent could not have not believed that p. The suggestion seems to run contrary to intuitions about doxastic Frankfurt cases, but Peels thinks that he can offer a plausible account of these. (The relevant cases are ones in which an agent violates some intellectual obligation unaided, but where some mechanism for which they are not responsible would have ensured violation of the obligation and a resulting bad belief if the agent had been inclined to discharge the obligation.) Since knowledge and epistemic justification does not imply the corresponding capacity to believe otherwise, a conclusion of this chapter is that epistemically justified belief and responsible belief are distinct. (Their relation is further discussed in an appendix.)

Chapter 5 turns to ignorance as a doxastic excuse. Here Peels argues that ignorance excuses some belief if it is blameless ignorance of either all-things-considered obligations to which the belief is relevantly related, one's ability to meet those obligations, or lack of foresight regarding them. On this account, blameworthy belief must stem from an act of akrasia regarding one's intellectual obligations. This makes responsible belief radically subjective. According to some philosophers who accept similar subjective constraints on blameworthiness (e.g. Michael Zimmerman), the relevant akratic acts are rare and hard to identify, meaning that we can rarely, if ever, know that someone is to blame for something. However, Peels argues that intellectual akrasia is quite common, in part because we often dormantly or tacitly believe that our actions violate intellectual obligations.

In Chapter 6, finally, Peels argues that the excusing role of bad luck with respect to the formation of one's beliefs can be reduced to that of force and ignorance. He also deals with the worry that since virtually all of our beliefs are subject to some kind of luck, and since luck undermines blameworthiness, we are blameworthy for virtually none of our beliefs. A central part of the solution employs the strategy, familiar from Zimmerman and others, to deny that the degree of blame deserved can be affected by luck, but insist that luck can affect the scope of blameworthiness-- what one is to blame for. A remaining problem is that luck often decides not only the consequences of blameworthy failures to discharge intellectual obligations, but also the availability of evidence and formation of epistemic mechanisms and virtue. If luck undermines responsibility, it is unclear how we can meaningfully attribute different degrees of blameworthiness. In response to this worry, Peels invokes the fact that luck, as he understands it, is restricted to what might easily have happened and argues that this adequately captures the extent to which we think that responsibility is undermined.

The book contains much to admire. The argument is clear and typically reasonable and convincing, and the book as a whole provides a useful overview of the interesting terrain between epistemology and moral responsibility research. Unsurprisingly, given its rich content, the book also contains much that merits further refinement, discussion, and disagreement. For example, I think that the account of different forms of belief needs to be further tweaked, remain worried about the notion of obligation at work, and am unmoved by the argument against objective epistemic obligations, unconvinced by Peels' treatment of Frankfurt scenarios, skeptical about the (fairly standard) account of luck that Peels works with, and doubtful that Peels' solution to the problem of doxastic luck avoids being radically revisionary about our blaming practices. On most of these points, however, I found Peels' discussion useful in challenging my preconceived notions and sharpening my own thinking.

In what follows, I will suggest that, although I think that Peels has identified an interesting class of intellectual obligations and a corresponding notion of responsible belief, he has missed an important class of obligations and sources of doxastic blameworthiness, possibly by understanding doxastic control too much in line with control over actions and by operating with an understanding of blame too closely associated with moral blame.

Start with Peels' thesis that we lack the sort of control over our beliefs required for obligations to believe things, such that we can be blameworthy for not discharging those obligations. Peels might well be right that we typically lack intentional control over whether to believe some particular proposition. As he recognizes, however, and as several people have argued, we also lack intentional control over something that most agree that we do control in a way compatible with direct responsibility: our intentions. Moreover, beliefs display the two features that most saliently make intentions paradigmatic objects of responsibility: their formation is (i) sensitive to (object-directed) reasons and (ii) subject to personal-level judgment regarding those reasons. But Peels seems to offer two considerations against the suggestion that reasons responsiveness does not ground relevant control. First, he claims that the suggestion over-generates. Fear is clearly responsive to reasons: I would be scared if a grizzly bear suddenly walked into my office, but not if a kitten did. But in the former case, Peels claims, "my fear is normally not under my control" in a way that grounds responsibility (80). Second, if I have equally good reasons to do A and ~A, I can equally well intend both. By contrast, "my doxastic attitude is never up to me, not even in cases in which my evidence regarding p is balanced" (80).

I find the over-generation argument unconvincing. Setting aside the possibility that the mere sight of a living grizzly up close makes it impossible for me to rationally assess the situation, the grizzly case does nothing to suggest that fear is not, in general, controlled by my judgment about whether something is to be feared, and thereby controlled by me. Admittedly, it might seem that neither blame nor praise is appropriate for fearing the grizzly. But that leaves the possibility of a neutral assessment and seems easily explained by the fact that there is little room for divergent conclusions for those of remotely sound judgment: fearing the grizzly is the upshot of neither substandard judgment making it worthy of blame, nor superstandard judgment making it worthy of praise. (Compare a case involving actions: someone who notices that their neighbor forgot to lock their door when leaving for work deserves neither blame nor praise for not entering their house and stealing their valuables.) Moreover, it seems to me at least that if I underestimate how much the grizzly is to be feared and thus react slowly to the situation, I can reasonably blame myself for not fearing the grizzly more. (Likewise if I'm overly fearful of the kitten.)

Nor am I convinced by the cases meant to show that it is never up to us what to believe. It is true that the cases that Peels considers -- cases where the evidence for and against p is balanced -- seem to leave (rational) room for neither belief nor disbelief, only for suspended belief. Moreover, these might seem to be the cases to consider. After all, the sorts of cases that most clearly display how actions are up to us are those where the reasons for the alternatives are reasonably evenly balanced. On closer reflection, however, these cases are disanalogous: the relevant alternatives in the belief case are not a proposition or its negation, but belief, disbelief, and suspended belief. We should thus look at cases where the evidence makes it non-obvious whether to (dis)believe a proposition or suspend belief, and where this can only be settled by a non-trivial judgment on part of the agent. In considering such cases, the belief is up to the agent in a straightforward sense. In response, Peels might argue that this sense is irrelevant for blameworthiness. But this, I think, remains to be shown.

One might think that our beliefs are not up to us in the relevant way because blame seems inappropriate as a response to a belief formed as the result of a substandard assessment of the evidence. However, I suspect that such resistance might come from thinking of blame in the wrong way. Though Peels understands blame as a negative responsibility-imputing affective attitude, belonging with resentment, outrage, indignation, compunction, and remorse, little is said about what attitude it is, more precisely. Because of what is left open here, I wonder if the intuitive plausibility of some of Peels' discussions depends on understanding blame along the lines of the attitudes getting the most focus in debates about moral blameworthiness: indignation and guilt. (Perhaps symptomatically, when Peels gives examples of blameworthy beliefs, these are characteristically described as resulting from the moral vice of laziness.) While such emotions might seem most clearly appropriate in response to willful and unjustified neglect of important matters, they seem less appropriate in response to false or unjustified beliefs formed as a result of a substandard evaluation of the evidence.

Contrast these negative affective attitudes with those characteristically found in cases involving what I have elsewhere called "skill blame" (Björnsson 2017). Engaging in most activities that require skill, we distinguish between cases where failure is due to circumstances and cases where it is due to agential shortcomings in relation to some operative standard. When a chess player makes a move that leads to a loss, or a soccer player's pass fails to reach her team mate, she might think two quite different thoughts. She might think that the upshot was due to the difficulty of the situation -- it was one of those in which success is impossible or requires execution out of the ordinary. Or she might think that it was her fault, for falling short of relevant standards (in failing to consider some important possible counter-moves, or in misjudging an angle, say). In thinking that the upshot was her fault, she would not be thinking that guilt would be the appropriate response on her part, or indignation on part of others. But she would characteristically have a (modest) negative affective reaction to her shortcoming based on understanding it as the source, or explanation, of the failure, and might expect others -- her coach, say -- to have similar thoughts and reactions. I submit that there is nothing strange or inappropriate about such thoughts and reactions, as they are part and parcel of any human activity involving conscious attempts to become better at achieving certain kinds of outcomes. Moreover, in thinking that the outcome was her fault and having corresponding negative reactions, I suggest, one is blaming her even in the absence of retributive elements familiar from core cases of moral blame.

But now notice two things. The first is that such blame does not seem to rely for its fittingness on any prior failure on the part of the agent to intentionally discharge some obligation interestingly related to the outcome: blame for the outcome seems to be grounded directly in the failure to judge the situation sufficiently well, or fine-tune action sufficiently in relation to it. The second is that it seems quite appropriate to blame oneself in this way for a false or unjustified belief resulting from a substandard evaluation of the evidence. I might well think that it was my fault that I formed the belief based on insufficient evidence, due to my substandard judgment rather than lack of evidence or lack of time, and I might kick myself for it. Moreover, as with the chess and soccer examples, it seems that this sort of blame requires no failure to intentionally act in ways discharging some intellectual obligation prior to the substandard judgment.

If I am right that we should acknowledge that our beliefs are up to us in a way that grounds a recognizable form of doxastic blame (and corresponding doxastic obligations), this would significantly add to the picture of responsible belief that Peels offers. But it would do nothing, as far as I can tell, to undermine what he says about other sources of doxastic blame, and other considerations relevant to issues of responsible belief. There would still be much to learn from this book.


Björnsson, Gunnar 2017: 'Explaining Away Epistemic Skepticism About Culpability'. In Oxford Studies in Agency and Responsibility. Shoemaker, David (ed.) Oxford University Press pp. 141-64.