Restorative Free Will: Back to the Biological Base

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Bruce N. Waller, Restorative Free Will: Back to the Biological Base, Lexington Books, 2015, 235pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498522380.

Reviewed by Gregg D. Caruso, SUNY Corning


Bruce N. Waller has long been a fervent and outspoken critic of moral responsibility and the concept of just deserts (see Waller 1990, 2011, 2015). In his previous work, he has attempted to "destroy moral responsibility, drive a stake in its heart, and bury it at the crossroads" (viii). In Restorative Free Will, however, he sets out on a different task: to defend a provocative and original account of free will -- one which is naturalistic, non-miraculous, and liberated from the burden of justifying moral responsibility (something he still contends cannot be done). While I ultimately think Waller's account fails to preserve what is of central philosophical and practical importance in the historical debate, for reasons I will explain below, I cannot recommend this book more highly. Questioning many contemporary assumptions about free will and moral responsibility, Waller's book is daring, thought-provoking, and a must-read for anyone interested in the free will debate.

Waller's account of restorative free will attempts to restore free will to its larger role in animal behavior and eliminate claims to human uniqueness that have, over time, distorted our understanding of the concept. Waller attempts to show that not only can free will survive the demise of moral responsibility, our understanding of free will can flourish and expand and deepen when it is freed from the dead weight of moral responsibility. Bringing to bear a remarkable number of studies in psychology, neuropsychology, biology, primatology, sociology, and anthropology, Waller provides one of the strongest cases in the literature for extending free will downward on the phylogenetic scale.

In Chapter 1, Waller introduces his account of restorative free will. He begins by defining free will as "the capacity to effectively explore alternative paths in response to a combination of environmental contingencies and internal motives" (1). He claims, "essential elements of that capacity include the ability to discriminate among and evaluate alternatives and the ability to adjust the level of behavioral variability to environmental conditions" (1). Restorative free will, according to Waller, is not a revisionist account of free will. Nor is it an account of how the folk think of free will. It is also not an account that traces free will back to the views of ancient people, popular religions, or ancient myths. Rather, he contends, it is a view of free will, which restores free will to many species that have been denied free will under accounts contrived by humans to claim exclusive rights to free will. It is concerned with "the free will that many species enjoyed and practiced long before humans evolved, the free will deeply rooted in adaptive animal behavior, and the free will that humans share with a variety of other species" (3).

Later in the book, primarily in Chapter 8, Waller explains that there are two main elements of restorative free will: options and control. Regarding the former, he writes: "Free will requires the capacity to effectively explore open alternatives; that includes both the capacity to explore open alternatives, and to effectively explore those alternatives" (140). The kind of options Waller has in mind, however, are not "absolute options" or "open alternatives that are chosen independently of all conditioned preferences and situational influences" (140). Such options, we are told, may be appropriate for gods but not foraging mice or humans.

Human animals do not need alternatives that transcend our conditioned characters and our environmental influences; to the contrary, like other animals that evolved in and must survive in this changing world, we need options that are closely tied to changing environmental contingencies (140).

According to Waller, our characters, situations, and histories may determine our choices, but so long as the choice process does not "bypass" us (Mele 1995, 2006; Nahmias 2011) then "we have all the free will we want or need" (141). In addition to options, Waller argues we must also be able to vary the levels of exploration and control in relation to varying environmental conditions. Here again "absolute control" is not needed. Instead, Waller argues, we want control that enables us to consider alternatives, place them in some workable order, and make our own choices.

On Waller's account, open alternatives and control balance one another out as conditions change. To help explain how this balancing occurs, Waller turns to the example of foraging animals. When a food source is reliable, foraging animals continue to engage in some behavioral variability, but that variability is reduced while the control over a reliable food source is greater. As the reliability of that food source wanes, behavioral variability waxes -- i.e., the animal engages in a greater variety of overall behavior, it explores more alternative paths, tries new techniques, or new combinations of behavior (144). Vital to the effective exercise of control, then, is the opportunity to pursue paths that are genuinely productive, and that requires adjusting to changing conditions and having access to workable and controllable paths when a path that has been favored and that seems (and perhaps was) productive is no longer beneficial or promising.

Throughout the book, Waller forcefully rejects all notions of human uniqueness as well as those accounts of free will that are based on them. He writes:

Free will is not the quality that makes us godlike, nor is it the special gift of God to his last and favorite creation. Free will is not unique to humans, it does not require a high level of reflective rationality, it does not support moral responsibility, and it does not involve any special causa sui power (1).

To fully appreciate the nature and value of free will, Waller argues, it is important that we go back to the evolutionary processes that shaped free will in a rich variety of species. While human free will has some distinctive features, focusing exclusively on it results in a distorted account since "we treat the distinctive features of human free will as the essentials of free will, when in fact they are only enhancements" (3).

In Chapters 2 through 5, Waller examines how these distortions came about, why they were added, and why they are impediments. He argues that belief in human uniqueness is widespread and stems from four main sources: (a) our religious myths (discussed in Chapters 2 and 4) -- which emphasize that we are God's favorite creation, we are made in the image of God, and we are capable of exercising god-like powers; (b) belief in a just world (discussed in Chapter 4); and when these are no longer plausible, (c) our presumed special rational powers (discussed in Chapter 3); and (d) our desire to preserve moral responsibility (discussed in Chapter 5). These chapters are worth the price of admission on their own. Waller does an excellent job tracing belief in human uniqueness through Aristotle, the Hebraic creation myths, Renaissance thinkers like Pico della Mirandola, contemporary libertarians such as Chisholm and Sartre, and naturalistic compatibilists who emphasize the importance of reason and moral responsibility.

One of the many virtues of the book is Waller's exhaustive examination of the various and often amazing abilities of animals and how they undermine claims of human uniqueness. Waller brings to bear a wealth of empirical research in primatology and other fields to show that chimpanzees, for instance, are capable of using tools, making plans, engaging in purposeful deception, and even attributing intentions, knowledge, and lack of specific knowledge to others. While Waller does not deny that human deliberative intelligence enlarges and enhances the human exercise of so-called restorative free will, he argues that it does not establish a sharp distinction between human free will and the free will of chimpanzees, white-footed mice, dung beetles, and other foraging animals. These sections on animal cognition and behavior make exceedingly vivid an important philosophical point -- i.e., that humans are animals (not partially animal, but completely animal) and our powers and abilities differ from other animals only in degree, not kind.

My main disagreement with Waller has to do with his preserving the term "free will" to describe the kind of control in action shared by humans and other foraging animals. As Waller describes early in the book, we have long had a friendly disagreement on this point:

Gregg Caruso . . . has helped me to see connections and problems that I had entirely overlooked, and I greatly admire his critique of moral responsibility. The question of whether free will should be eliminated (along with moral responsibility) is one of the very few philosophical issues on which we disagree . . . My hope is that Gregg can be turned back from his sinful path of free will eliminativism, and become a fervent free will preservationist (x).

While no one has influenced my thinking on moral responsibility more than Waller, my good friend has not yet convinced me that I should give up my sinful ways and reject my free will eliminativism (Caruso 2012, 2015). While I completely agree with Waller that backward-looking moral responsibility, praise and blame, and the reactive attitudes of resentment, indignation, guilt, and righteous anger cannot be justified in a naturalist world devoid of miracles, I see no justification for, or benefit in, preserving his restorative notion of free will.

On Waller's account, free will amounts to the ability to discriminate among and evaluate alternatives and the ability to adjust the level of behavioral variability to environmental conditions. I contend that this conception of free will makes the dispute between compatibilists and incompatibilists a moot point since no one in the debate denies that we have the kinds of abilities discussed by Waller. The question most philosophers are interested in -- the question that is of central philosophical and practical importance in the free will debate -- is whether these abilities are enough to justify certain kinds of desert-based judgments, attitudes, or treatments in response to decisions or actions that an agent performed or failed to perform. It's hard to see how Waller's conception of free will helps resolve that debate, or frankly any other significant debate related to the historical problem of free will. Even if we grant Waller his restorative free will, it is difficult to think of anything of importance that follows from it regarding our everyday practices, judgments, and attitudes. By liberating free will from moral responsibility, Waller has seemingly liberated it from all of its philosophical and practical importance.

I have elsewhere argued that there are several distinct advantages to defining free will in terms of the control in action required for basic desert moral responsibility (see Caruso and Morris): (a) it provides a neutral definition that virtually all parties can agree to -- i.e., it doesn't exclude from the outset various conceptions of free will that are available for compatibilists, libertarians, and free will skeptics to adopt; (b) it captures the practical importance of the debate; (c) it fits with the commonsense (i.e., folk) understanding of these concepts; and, perhaps most importantly, (d) rejecting this understanding of free will makes it difficult to understand the nature of the substantive disputes that are driving the free will debate.

Since much of the practical interest surrounding the free will debate owes its existence to how free will is relevant to questions relating to moral and socio-political issues, it would seem misguided to redefine free will in a way that detracts from its relevance to such practical matters. Consider, for instance the issue of criminal punishment. Traditionally, criminal punishment and incarceration are seen as justified, in part, by the desert of offenders: because they are guilty -- morally, and not merely legally, guilty -- we can impose significant sanctions on them. If free will skeptics are right, agents are never deserving of the imposition of such sanctions. Thus free will skepticism has practical implications: it apparently entails that major elements of the criminal justice system are unjustified. This is just one example of the practical importance of the debate, and an account of free will which links it to backward-looking moral responsibility captures it since it maintains that free will is inextricably connected to the justification of certain kinds of judgments, attitudes, and treatments that are important to criminal law, social policy, and our interpersonal relationships. Definitions of free will that sever the relationship between free will and moral responsibility lose sight of the practical implications of the debate and, hence, remove much of its interest.

Furthermore, defining free will in relation to basic desert moral responsibility also has the advantage of reflecting how ordinary folk conceive of these issues. Jasmine Carey and Delroy Paulhus (2013), for instance, have found that where belief in free will is strongest we tend to find increased retributive moral judgments. More specifically, they found that free will believers were more likely to call for harsher criminal punishment in a number of hypothetical scenarios. Azim Shariff et al. (2014) have reported similar findings. In one study Shariff and his colleagues found that people with weaker free will beliefs endorsed less retributive attitudes regarding punishment of criminals, yet their consequentialist attitudes were unaffected. In a different study they found that experimentally diminishing free will belief through anti-free-will arguments diminished retributive punishment, suggesting a causal relationship. This research provides prima facie support for thinking that the folk conceive of free will as linked with moral responsibility and, more specifically, retributivist judgments. If Waller wants to reduce the latter, as I know he does, his free will preservationism may be counterproductive from a practical standpoint.

Waller is, of course, free to defend a revisionist account of free will -- one that sets out to alter the commonsense meaning of "free will" in a way that allows us to assert its existence without committing ourselves to the more philosophically problematic aspects of the notion. Revisionists in the free will debate basically hold that the way we ought to think about "free will" and/or "moral responsibility" differs from the way the folk actually do think about them. Waller, however, explicitly denies that restorative free will is revisionist. While he acknowledges that his conception of free will does not always adhere to the ordinary folk understanding, he claims it nonetheless attempts to "explain the ways in which the ordinary understanding of free will is based on the key elements of animal free will, and also attempts to understand why additional elements -- not found in animal free will -- were grafted onto the more plausible basic account of free will" (189). If ordinary folk, however, view free will and moral responsibility as inextricably linked -- as I believe they do -- then Waller is downplaying the extent to which his account requires revisionism.

In my estimate, Waller's account is a form of revisionism, but one that differs in significant ways from the revisionism of (say) Manuel Vargas (2007, 2009, 2013). Vargas defends a version of revisionism which is predicated on two main theses: (1) our commonsense intuitions about free will and moral responsibility are primarily libertarian in nature (his descriptive thesis); and (2) we ought to revise our concepts of "free will" and "moral responsibility" in such a way as to strip them of their libertarian commitments (his prescriptive thesis). Vargas' revisionism, however, while jettisoning what he takes to be our predominantly libertarian intuitions about free will, maintains the all-important link between free will and moral responsibility. In Vargas' revisionism, some folk psychological intuitions are open for revision (e.g., our libertarian intuitions), while others remain central to our understanding of free will (e.g., those related to our moral responsibility practices). I maintain that any revisionist account that severs all connection to moral responsibility, as Waller's does, ends up becoming pragmatically vacuous, uninteresting, and unacceptable from the standpoint of the historical debate.

This brings me to my last point. The question of whether we should eliminate or preserve the concept of free will depends on substantive assumptions about reference. I have recently argued, however, that on either a descriptive account of reference or a causal-historical one, eliminativism appears to follow (Caruso 2015). On a descriptive account of reference, eliminativism follows since the folk concept of free will contains significant error, hence nothing satisfies the description. Yet, on a causal-historical account of reference, eliminativism also seems to follow since it is prima facie plausible to think that the concept of "free will" was originally baptized in a causal-historical story which appealed, at least in part, to our first-person experience of free agency. And since the phenomenology of free agency is best viewed (I claim) in a libertarian and incompatibilist sense (see Caruso 2012; Deery et al. 2013), one that is likely in error, eliminativism awaits us down this path too.

While Waller briefly considers my eliminativist challenge in his final chapter, he fails to address the core question: why should we fix the reference of "free will" to the kinds of abilities we share with foraging animals? Spelling out the benefits of adopting a naturalistic, non-miraculous account of free will is one thing, but justifying preservationism is another. In my estimate, Waller does an excellent job at the former but fails at the latter. What is needed (but not provided) is a sustained justification of preservationism and an account of reference fixing that makes it plausible.

Let me end by saying that despite these criticisms, this book is worthy of careful examination. Waller's account of restorative free will is original and provocative. It will give readers much to think about. His writing is clear, direct, often humorous, and always insightful. Whether or not one agrees with him, Waller raises important and difficult questions, forcing us to reconsider our assumptions about human uniqueness, moral responsibility, and free will. Moving forward, philosophers will definitely need to take seriously his reverse semi-compatibilism (my term, not his), which maintains that we should reject moral responsibility but preserve restorative free will.


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Caruso, Gregg D. 2012. Free will and consciousness: A determinist account of the illusion of free will. Lexington Books.

Caruso, Gregg D. 2015. Free will eliminativism: Reference, error, and phenomenology. Philosophical Studies 172 (10): 2823-2833.

Caruso, Gregg D., Stephen G. Morris. Manuscript. Compatibilism and retributive desert moral responsibility: On what is of central philosophical and practical importance. Currently under review.

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