Restoring Responsibility: Ethics in Government, Business, and Healthcare

Placeholder book cover

Dennis F. Thompson, Restoring Responsibility: Ethics in Government, Business, and Healthcare, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 360pp, $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521547229.

Reviewed by Denis G. Arnold, University of Tennessee, Knoxville


Dennis Thompson tells the story of the director of a super market chain who, at a business ethics conference for corporate leaders, emphasized the need to teach customers ethical behavior so they would not steal grocery carts for use at home. The executive, Thompson believes, mistakenly placed undue emphasis on a problem of individual ethics, rather than focusing on more important questions concerning institutional ethics. Institutional ethics concerns "the relations of individuals as members of organizations and as citizens" (300). For the last twenty-five years Thompson has been arguing that applied ethicists should focus their attention on problems related to institutional responsibility rather than mere individual responsibility. This book is a collection of sixteen essays written in that period, two-thirds of which have as their subject governmental institutions. The main theme of the essays is that institutions in democratic societies will better serve the public if they operate in accordance with democratically determined ethical principles.

The title of this book is somewhat misleading in that the author is not concerned with "restoring responsibility" that has disappeared from once honorable public institutions. Indeed, he believes that such institutions are less vicious than in the past. His aim is instead to defend a more robust conception of responsibility for social and political institutions. The account of responsibility that emerges includes a number of distinctive features. First, it is democratic in that it regards individual agents within institutions as responsible for institutional failings. One might suppose that an applied ethicist who was interested in turning attention away from individuals and toward institutions would place the locus of responsibility for wrongdoing upon the institution itself rather than individual members of the institutions. Instead, Thompson argues that in democratic societies, individuals are ultimately accountable for their institutions. Major responsibility lies with the designers of the institutions, but even low-level bureaucrats bear some of the responsibility for institutional failings. In "The Problem of Many Hands," for example, Thompson argues that their responsibility ought to be assessed by a hypothetical criterion based on what the average bureaucrat could accomplish in the circumstances -- he thus invokes a "reasonable bureaucrat standard" (28).

A second feature of the account of institutional responsibility defended here concerns justification. In democracies, reasonable persons may disagree about the principles that apply in institutional life. In such cases, individuals ought to be expected to justify their positions and defend them against competing views. For example, in "Judicial Responsibility" Thompson argues that judges act irresponsibly when their legal opinions do not reflect their actual reasons for a judgment. To prevent such occurrences he recommends Kant's view that "no rule can be an acceptable principle of public law unless it can be publicly stated without defeating its own purpose" (81). Legal opinions that cannot meet this criterion should not be regarded as acceptable. It is of considerable interest that the standards of justification Thompson defends are intended, in part, to prevent particular interest groups from having undue influence over institutional outcomes. The position he defends allows experts to determine institutional ethics policies while remaining responsive to communities. Thompson is an advocate of democratic responsiveness, rather than interest group politics. This is evident in "Hospital Ethics" where he argues for the robust use of ethics committees in establishing hospital policies and procedures. Hospitals that do this will, he believes, be in a better position to respond to external pressures and challenges (284-287). By establishing clear ethical norms for hospitals, ethics committees can help to reduce the need for "ethics consults" with the ethics committee that so many medical practitioners are reluctant to request because of the time and energy necessary for a successful consult. There is a tension here, however, between the democratic responsiveness the author advocates, and the role of experts such as those who serve on ethics committees. A typical ethics committee will include experienced physicians, senior nurses, trained social workers, hospital administrators, and at least one medical ethicist. The level of expertise necessary for making sound judgments in many cases is substantial. Yet if a hospital is supposed to be democratically responsive in a serious manner, it must take into account the judgments of community members who may be in fundamental disagreement with the ethics committee while lacking relevant clinical expertise. A committee that can insulate itself against criticism from the community at large by appealing to carefully reasoned ethical judgments grounded in sound clinical expertise may well be in the best interest of the hospital and its patients, but it seems a poor example of democratic responsiveness.

A third feature of the author's account of institutional responsibility concerns institutional failures. What is to be done in response to the systemic failures at major institutions such as Enron, Arthur Andersen, the Catholic Church, and the FBI? One popular view holds that such institutions, at least those still in existence, need to take proactive, credible steps to ensure that they are staffed and managed by trustworthy individuals. Once this is done, the public at large will again have a legitimate basis for trust. Thompson is more skeptical. He argues in "Restoring Distrust" that we need to institutionalize distrust. At Arthur Andersen, for example, Enron's auditors shared office space with the more lucrative Enron consulting unit of the company. Andersen either trusted that its management consultants would not exert influence over the judgment of its auditors, or it turned a blind eye to the practice. One means of avoiding such conflicts of interest is to institutionalize distrust within organizations. Andersen might have avoided such transparent conflicts of interest if it had built firewalls between its auditors and its management consultants throughout the organization. To do so would not be, as some might contend, to assume that all employees would engage in unscrupulous behavior if given a chance, but instead to recognize that inevitably some will. The prudential deployment of mistrust in an organization might thereby restore the public's trust in the same organization.

The final feature of Thompson's account of institutional ethics concerns his method of analysis. Because, in his judgment, "institutional ethics does not aspire to be a branch of philosophy" its focus should be on institutional norms (7). While he acknowledges the usefulness of codes of conduct, he believes that the attention of applied ethics ought to be on the general principles that govern individual institutions. He eschews altogether the need for theorizing at a deeper level about foundational ethical principles. His reason for this appears to be pragmatic. Debates at this midrange can better accommodate the diverse perspectives of citizens in democratic societies. Thompson does not often focus on the articulation of such principles, nor does he compare his position to views that might be regarded as similar, such as the principlism of Beauchamp and Childress.[1] Further, the view he defends has limited applicability for many institutions. For example, nongovernmental organizations and multinational corporations often operate in nondemocratic environments. Norms of behavior grounded in responsiveness to U.S. or European democracies, for example, cannot be regarded as legitimate by citizens in China or Saudi Arabia. But NGOs and MNCs operating in such nations face serious ethical questions concerning the appropriate norms of behavior, whether concerning sex-based discrimination or health and safety standards on the factory floor. It is here that appeals to universal moral norms are of considerable importance. Such norms can inform the voluntary codes of ethics that organizations adhere to in their operations in nondemocractic nations. But such norms are in need of firm theoretical foundations. Take the case of basic human rights. Is a right to freedom the only right that such organizations should adhere to, or do they also have an obligation to respect basic welfare rights? A sound philosophical justification of basic human rights can provide the basis for codes of ethics in a way that democratic responsiveness cannot.[2] The derivation of midrange principles from ethical theory is a philosophical enterprise, so, contra Thompson, there are prima facie reasons for thinking that applied ethics is a branch of philosophy.

One of Thompson's main contentions in these essays is that professional ethics is, and should be, undergoing a shift from a concern with the appropriate relations among individuals to concerns about institutional norms and procedures. This is most apparent in bioethics, where patient-physician relationships have come to be governed by a well-established set of ethical principles, grounded in respect for patient autonomy. Many of the most important debates in bioethics are now about the allocation of resources in organizations such as HMOs and hospitals, and the appropriate policies of market driven health care enterprises. However, this "institutional turn" occurred much earlier in business ethics, where "organizational ethics" has been a central part of the field for over twenty years.[3] Indeed, the language of organizational ethics is commonplace whereas the language of "institutional ethics" is seldom encountered in business ethics, and is increasingly common in bioethics. It is curious therefore that the author does not engage more substantially with this well developed and flourishing literature.[4]

Readers interested in the ethical norms that should guide governmental institutions in democratic societies will find Thompson's analyses of these issues to be subtle and persuasive. Additionally, his work at the intersections of government ethics, bioethics, and business ethics merits attention, in part, for the light he sheds on important issues at the forefront of applied ethics. Ethicists would be remiss to ignore this collection of essays.

[1] Tom L. Beauchamp and James F. Childress, Principles of Biomedical Ethics, 5th ed. (New York: Oxford University Press, 2001).

[2] See, for example, Henry Shue, Basic Rights: Subsistence, Affluence, and U.S. Foreign Policy (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1996); and Charles Jones, Global Justice: Defending Cosmopolitanism (New York: Oxford University Press, 1999).

[3] Early contributions to this literature include Thomas Donaldson, Corporations and Morality (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1982); Patricia Wehane, Persons, Rights, and Corporations (Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice Hall, 1985); and Norman E. Bowie, "The Moral Obligations of Multinational Corporations," in Problems of International Justice, ed., Steven Luper-Foy (New York: Westview Press, 1987): 97-113.

[4] See, for example, Edwin Hartman, Organizational Ethics and the Good Life (New York: Oxford University Press, 1996); and Edward M. Spencer, Ann E. Mills, Mary V. Rorty, Patricia H. Werhane, Organization Ethics in Health Care (New York: Oxford University Press, 2000).