Rethinking Commonsense Psychology: A Critique of Folk Psychology, Theory of Mind and Simulation

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Matthew Ratcliffe, Rethinking Commonsense Psychology: A Critique of Folk Psychology, Theory of Mind and Simulation, Palgrave Macmillan, 2007, 271pp., $74.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780230007109.

Reviewed by Daniel D. Hutto, University of Hertfordshire


Ask nearly any analytic philosopher of mind how we understand intentional actions performed for reasons and you are bound to be told that we do so by deploying mental concepts, such as beliefs and desires, in systematic ways.  This way of making sense of actions is known as commonsense or folk psychology (or CSP or FP for short). There have been many interesting debates about CSP over the years. These have focused on questions including: How fundamental and universal is this practice?  Which species engage in it?  What mechanisms underwrite the competence?  How is the ability acquired?  And, what exactly is its status (e.g. is it a kind of theory or simulative ability?  If it's a theory, is it a good theory, etc.)?  Philosophers divide in their responses to such questions, but practically all of them agree that CSP is at least a prominent and important part of our everyday understanding and that it grounds at least some very important social practices.

Ratcliffe's book is the first sustained attempt to challenge the idea that CSP (as traditionally understood) even exists -- other than as a philosopher's imposition.  He aims to show that those who have simply assumed that CSP exists have made the mistake of 'thinking without looking'; that they have -- as it were -- adopted a certain picture of our everyday practices which obscures its true features.  To correct this he takes his lead from the phenomenological tradition and offers a more sensitive rendering of what those practices, in fact, look like along with a sustained "critique of commonplace descriptions of folk psychology" (2).  His ultimate conclusion is that "what is labeled an 'everyday', 'commonsense' or 'folk' psychology and routinely accepted as the core of human social life is actually nothing of the sort and bears little relation to how people understand each other" (2).  The counterpoint to this (seemingly) negative message is an attempt to clarify what really lies at the heart of our everyday social engagements.  Thus the book promotes the idea that "Social understanding … is a form of what is often called 'situated', 'embodied, embedded' or 'extended' cognition.  Social understanding is inextricable from interaction with the social world" (86, see also 107; emphasis added).

Nevertheless it is the book's bold conclusion that stands out: CSP is not the name of our familiar way of making sense of intentional action; rather it is a philosophical creation -- "a misguided reification of abstractions" (23).  In fact, nothing at all answers to the name of CSP (see also Morton 2007).  Obviously, this constitutes the most interesting and powerful challenge to CSP.  By comparison, the Churchlands, who hold that CSP is a radically false theory, are 'weak' eliminativists.  For the claim is that FP does not exist at all, other than -- at best -- in the fevered imaginations of some philosophers.  As Ratcliffe insists "FP is not strictly speaking false.  It is, rather, an abstraction from social life that is misleading in various respects and has no psychological reality.  At best, it is a convenient way of talking in certain areas of philosophy" (23).  It is a false picture; an imposition -- a sort of misdescription or misunderstanding of our practices.  It is a kind of myth that philosophical fantasists have latched onto because they have failed to attend closely enough to our real practices which presumably operate in a quite different way.  This is strong stuff.  Should we accept it?

A natural response to such Radical Ratcliffian Eliminativism would be to say that something at least approximating to the traditional CSP understanding must be at work in at least some region of our daily sense-making practice concerning intentional action.  In some moods Ratcliffe seems prepared to acknowledge this, in others he is less forgiving.  He lays various claims about CSP on the table, ranging from the reasonable to the extremely radical.  At the calmer end of the spectrum we find modest correctives.  Ratcliffe provides a wealth of evidence that CSP has had a distorting effect on our understanding of social cognition in at least two ways.  First, standard accounts of the nature of CSP construed as a kind of 'mindreading' activity systematically misrepresent the nature of our everyday way of making sense of one another.  They wrongly cast it as overly intellectual, as forever requiring inferential thinking, as being primarily spectatorial and wrongly focused on the postulation of inner causes.  In fact, it is nothing of the sort.  Second, the idea that CSP is central to our everyday ways of dealing with others obscures the fact that we operate with a much wider range and variety of heuristics for achieving this.  The right conclusion is that it is not just CSP that makes social understanding possible; many other things play a 'considerable role' too (89).

Against this backdrop, Ratcliffe asks just how frequently do we rely on FP?  His answer is that "there may be no such thing as a commonsense psychology, in the sense of a distinctive way of understanding people that is generally acknowledged as central to much or all of social life" (51, emphasis mine).  The idea that in 'most if not all' interactions we get by without FP is his favoured formulation, and it occurs frequently throughout the book (77, 78, 86).

When modestly advanced this claim comes out in the following form: "That we sometimes explain people's behaviour is, of course, something I take for granted throughout.  However, what I challenge is the assumption that explanations of why people do what they do can in most cases be fitted into the mould of FP" (25, see also 84).  His recurring leitmotif is that FP is not central to 'all social life', that it is not needed 'in many cases' and that other things do 'a great deal' if not 'most of the work' (5, 8, 91, 107).  This is certainly true.  We operate with a variety of heuristics and strategies in our social dealings.  CSP is, at best, just one amongst these many; it is only a small piece in a much larger mosaic.  It is surely not brought to bear in our primary or most basic ways of engaging with others.  Nor is it something that can operate successfully in isolation from these other, more embodied, embedded and engaged ways of interacting.

Ratcliffe is surely right to reject the hyperbolic claims that have been made about FP as the basis for "all social understanding" (99); it is ludicrous to suppose that it is implicated in “every aspect of social life” (101).  This observation is entirely compatible with the idea that, when purged of certain misleading philosophical pictures and when we adopt a suitably constrained view about its place in a wider set of practices, "an ability to interpret people in FP terms is a prerequisite for the ability to navigate [some] social situations" (99).

His investigation is initially cast in the form of a genuinely open inquiry which seeks to discover "whether FP adequately characterizes any aspect of interpersonal understanding and interaction" (84, see also 54).  Yet it clear upon reaching chapter seven of his book that he is extremely sceptical that CSP plays any role at all.  Ultimately he insists on a much harder line.  Really his observations about the limited scope of CSP are ultimately just part of a softening-up exercise.  They are meant to prepare his readers for claims of a much more extreme and questionable nature.  For he goes on to announce that we never make use of CSP and its imagined form of understanding actions plays no role in our particular form of life.  We are presented with the utterly deflationary appraisal that "FP is not a part of everyday interpersonal understanding at all but rather a theoretically motivated and misleading abstraction that has been imposed upon it" (57, emphasis added).

Ratcliffe's valuable analysis shows that standard proposals about the nature, scope, origins, and function of CSP are wrong-headed and ill-motivated.  What should we make of this?  There are more and less aggressive ways of responding.  Without doubt, there are a number of standard assumptions about CSP that can (and should) be legitimately distinguished and abandoned (e.g. that its main function is to provide third person predictions and explanations; that its explanations are 'causal' in any kind of Humean sense; that the practice implies the existence of 'inner representational states', etc.).  Nevertheless, it is surely possible to abandon all of these thoughts without abandoning CSP per se.  It is possible to separate our philosophically tainted rendering of it to form a more theoretically innocent one.  In effect we can distil a minimal conception of CSP that is not committed to any heavy philosophical theses.

The bottom line is that there is much philosophical confusion about CSP.  Yet amidst all this confusion an important fact stands out: "Almost all participants in these debates share the same view of what folk or commonsense psychology consists of" (2, see also 15).  We might well wonder why.  In adopting a more minimalist stance on FP we can not hope for an answer to this question other than that anyone who finds such features in our everyday understanding of reasons for actions must have been indoctrinated into that way of thinking "by Jones the philosopher" (46) or one of his confederates.

Just what drives Ratcliffe's extreme skepticism about FP's existence?  He makes clear that his chief worry concerns the fact that 'belief' and the like are not unitary concepts and that they have no distinctive roles to play in our everyday understanding of action (212).  He approvingly cites Needham's (1972) anthropological work which shows that our ordinary use of psychological concepts is not single-tracked, clear or well-defined.

It is certainly true that CSP practice is more complex and its terms have more variegated uses than is commonly recognized or highlighted.  Close scrutiny of CSP usage reveals that we talk of beliefs and desires (and related reasoning processes) in at least two distinctively different sorts of ways.  Sometimes we make sense of actions by making direct mention of a person's flat-out, unqualified propositional attitudes.  These are the kind that agents must have deployed in conducting their acts of explicit practical reasoning -- those that operate according to the rules of first-order classical logic.  They are what Ratcliffe calls sentential attitudes (or at least the beliefs in question are examples of such).

To be sure talk of propositional attitudes covers other sorts of cases too.  We might say of a dog that it believes that the cat is up the tree (to borrow a famous example from Malcolm).  Of course, we do not and should not expect that in saying this we are somehow specifying the true content of the dog's thought -- e.g. the precise mode of presentation under which it grasps the situation in question.  In making this sort of 'belief ascription' we are really only pointing out the worldly situation that the dog is reacting to.  We are using our own terms in ascribing it a 'belief', but this is only a shorthand way to say what it is interested in 'in extension'; it is not a characterization of the 'contents of its mind'.  This sort of practice applies not only to non-verbal animals and infants, but also to adult humans under certain circumstances.

It seems then that aspects of our everyday usage reveal that we do not always and everywhere think of beliefs and desires as being linguistically mediated.  At times we explain and predict behaviour by ascribing propositional attitudes that are partial and come in degrees.  In such cases our belief talk neither tracks nor implies anything about the agent's underlying psychological reality.  In accepting this defenders of CSP can happily concede that "there is considerable ambiguity surrounding the use of terms such as belief and even propositional attitude" (104).

But what can we safely conclude from all this?  Surely, not that CSP does not exist.  Rather this observation bids us to acknowledge that everyday folk psychological practice is richer and more stratified than some have supposed.  We should also note that the features that are most clearly and prominently associated with CSP -- such as its propositional and conceptual modularity, its role in flat-out practical reasoning, etc. -- only attach to the way we talk about propositional attitudes-as-sentential-attitudes.  But it hardly follows from this that CSP is not a core, discernable and important part of our everyday practice of making sense of actions performed for reasons.  Rather what these considerations show is that this practice may be an identifiable sub-part of a larger practice.

As noted, Ratcliffe also doubts the idea that beliefs and desires play distinctive and constitutive roles in our everyday understanding of intentional action.  This idea has a respectable philosophical lineage; one that can be traced back at least as far as the works of Aristotle.  On the standard rendering, beliefs define an agent's take on the world (i.e. how things are thought to be) and thus guide action and desires (or pro-attitudes), specify goals for action and are often construed as motivational states.  The formula for their basic combination is in effect a statement of the practical syllogism which nowadays trades under the 'central action principle'.  In effect it says: "If somebody desires x and believes that A-ing is a means of achieving X, then, ceteris paribus, he will do A" (Stueber 2006, 110).

In making his negative case against CSP, Ratcliffe seeks to demonstrate that "the clear cut distinction between belief-like and desire-like states, insisted on by FP, is not respected in everyday thought" (23).  Yet if we understand the principles that incorporate that distinction in an appropriately minimal sense, I see no evidence for believing this to be the case.

It is certainly true that our everyday understanding of action is unlikely to yield any more refined understanding of the distinct roles that these core intentional attitudes have in guiding and driving action, but it surely involves at least the level of understanding described above.  That is to say, CSP is surely neutral on proposals concerning any deeper analysis of the structure of reasons, such as Humeanism, Pure Cognitivism, or Anti-Psychologism.  Thus it may be that our everyday understanding of the roles played by the propositional attitudes is not up to the task of saying precisely how such roles are executed (and perhaps no more refined analysis is in the offing), but this does not make their basic job descriptions any less 'clear cut'.

Putting this together it seems possible to defend a minimal and modest conception of CSP as a distinctive and sophisticated practice making sense of actions in terms of reasons; a practice that warrants our serious attention and explanation.

In all, although I doubt his extreme, negative conclusion, Ratcliffe certainly knows his stuff and provides us with a powerful and phenomenologically sensitive corrective to certain misleading but sadly prevalent assumptions about the nature of our everyday understanding of action.  This is a challenging book that anyone working on these topics ought to read and take seriously.